Heidegger's Early Philosophy: The Phenomenology of Ecstatic Temporality

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James Luchte, Heidegger's Early Philosophy: The Phenomenology of Ecstatic Temporality, Continuum, 2008, 224pp., $130 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062970.

Reviewed by Theodore Kisiel, Northern Illinois University



For James Luchte, Heidegger’s early philosophy is the phenomenology of ecstatic, original temporality as it develops in the years 1924 to 1929. Basing his text on the three components of the phenomenological method — reduction, destruction, and construction — Luchte divides his study into three distinct yet overlapping parts — Heidegger would call them equiprimordial ‘parts’: the [original] Phenomenon, the Destruktion, and the Topos [= building site] of ecstatic temporality. By way of a contrast with Husserl’s phenomenology, Part 1 eventually pinpoints Heidegger’s ‘phenomenological’ reduction quite precisely in “moments of vision, truth events, radical breaks amid system, eruptions: revolution, poetry, art and events of questioning” (47, 59). These moments “breach” our everyday familiarity of being, suspend the normality of our matter-of-fact existence — what Husserl dubbed the “natural attitude” — and disclose our unique being-t/here in the full finitude of its original temporality. We thus come “to ‘know ourselves’ as an ‘event’ amid a world” into which we have been thrown (48). Luchte explains,

Heidegger contends that we can only know our own self when it has been resisted, broken or has encountered a limit-situation, via which each finds herself in her “truth.” Normality suspends … with an eclipse of the sun, an earthquake, a flood, the death of another — a truth event. (49)

The ontological conditions of possibility of such “finite knowing” are thoroughly explored in Part 2 by way of a detailed gloss of Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, Heidegger’s Destruktion of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, as well as related Kantian exegeses.