Heidegger's Early Philosophy: The Phenomenology of Ecstatic Temporality

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James Luchte, Heidegger's Early Philosophy: The Phenomenology of Ecstatic Temporality, Continuum, 2008, 224pp., $130 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062970.

Reviewed by Theodore Kisiel, Northern Illinois University



For James Luchte, Heidegger’s early philosophy is the phenomenology of ecstatic, original temporality as it develops in the years 1924 to 1929. Basing his text on the three components of the phenomenological method — reduction, destruction, and construction — Luchte divides his study into three distinct yet overlapping parts — Heidegger would call them equiprimordial ‘parts’: the [original] Phenomenon, the Destruktion, and the Topos [= building site] of ecstatic temporality. By way of a contrast with Husserl’s phenomenology, Part 1 eventually pinpoints Heidegger’s ‘phenomenological’ reduction quite precisely in “moments of vision, truth events, radical breaks amid system, eruptions: revolution, poetry, art and events of questioning” (47, 59). These moments “breach” our everyday familiarity of being, suspend the normality of our matter-of-fact existence — what Husserl dubbed the “natural attitude” — and disclose our unique being-t/here in the full finitude of its original temporality. We thus come “to ‘know ourselves’ as an ‘event’ amid a world” into which we have been thrown (48). Luchte explains,

Heidegger contends that we can only know our own self when it has been resisted, broken or has encountered a limit-situation, via which each finds herself in her “truth.” Normality suspends … with an eclipse of the sun, an earthquake, a flood, the death of another — a truth event. (49)

The ontological conditions of possibility of such “finite knowing” are thoroughly explored in Part 2 by way of a detailed gloss of Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, Heidegger’s Destruktion of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, as well as related Kantian exegeses.

The concluding chapters of Part 3 deal with the constructive tasks that accrue to Da-sein following the reductive disclosure of the topos of original temporality. From the opening pages, Luchte indicates that the path to the topos of original temporality is the ‘event’ of anticipatory resoluteness. But calling anticipatory resoluteness an ‘event’ is in fact a ‘category’ mistake, since it is more properly a responsive protoaction (Urhandlung) to the event of original temporality that includes: a readiness for the angst over my being-in-the-world, responsiveness to the call of my conscience (i.e., to the unique demands exacted by my own situation of be-ing), acceptance of my ‘guilt’ or finitude, and forerunning my death. In brief, it is a letting-BE of my self as being-in-the-world in its full facticity and finite possibility, the protoaction par excellence. In the same vein, the ‘self’ that comes into focus in this protoaction is at first an ‘event’ of disclosure in and through the call of conscience understood as the comprehensive “call of care” for my being-in-the-world. Through the response to the call, however, in which I become resolutely open to my unique holistic situation of being and action, this ‘self’ becomes a chosen task and lifetime project.

Following his mentor Reiner Schürmann, to whom this book is dedicated, Luchte stresses the “radical singularization of the self” that comes from the anticipatory realization of the “non-relational” character of the ownmost possibility of death — i.e., one dies alone, all worldly relations (with others, among things) fall away in the confrontation of my own death (161-173). Nevertheless, the horizon of temporality is constituted, in Schürmann’s terms, by the “double bind of natality and mortality” (160). The excessive emphasis on the anticipatory temporal movement of being-towards-death here leads to the relative neglect of the recoiling movement in anticipatory resoluteness to being-towards-birth (historical heritage, family inheritance and heredity). Thereby neglected is the limit situation of situationality itself, of finding oneself already situated willy-nilly in existence, “thrown” into the holistic context of a multi-relational historical world that is my/our very own, having been born into the historical community of a particular people and into a particular historical generation of that community (Sein und Zeit 384-5). The protoaction of anticipatory resoluteness retraces the entirety of the unitary and holistic movement of the thrown projection that is originary temporality from one finite extremity to the other, from the forerunning projection of my own death to the recoiling return to the inherited historical context into which I/we happen to have been born, which is therefore my/our ineluctable ‘fate’, in order to retrieve the precedent possibilities that are adjudged to be vitally relevant and apropos to our current historical situation as inherited and yet chosen possibilities that now come to meet us out of the projected future as our proper historical tasks. Reiner Schürmann sums up this “double bind” of our temporal and historical future by observing that “by virtue of mortality, the future solifies, by virtue of natality, it totalizes” (Broken Hegemonies, 19). “Mortality familiarizes us with our singularization to come”, he writes, to which we might add that the ‘accident’ of natality allocates to us our unique individual fates and our particular collective destiny (Ibid.).

Luchte comes across the task-like structure of our authentic and proper historical world in his gloss of Heidegger’s course on Leibniz’s logic in SS 1928. Here the self, as a for-the-sake-of-itself, in responding to its multi-relational historical world, freely chooses possibilities to make its very own and projects these upon that world as its proper tasks. The world thus invested with human purposes, ‘for-the-sake-of-whiches’ (likewise a nominalized prepositional phrase in Aristotle’s Greek, hou heneka) is now regarded, in Kantian fashion, as a whole of binding commitments (Bindungsganzes) for which the self is responsible and, at once, as an arena of freedom of movement granted by the leeway (Spielraum) or “space of play” opened up by these historical possibilities. This is clearly a “situated freedom”, the freedom of leeway granted by our particular historical world (146). In view of the mutual reciprocity between self and world, the self may be said to acquire its historical identity from its unique “world of binding commitments”, this historical world structured by our chosen purposes (Ibid.).

Then, Luchte adds his own touch to the character of these historical worlds:

However … these commitments can be unknotted via time, they are makeshift… . As free, Dasein chooses its possibilities, it orients itself to these chosen possibilities as a makeshift array of binding commitments. (146, my italics)

Makeshift (Notbehelf), stopgap, temporary expedient, on-the-spot improvisation, a provisional resolution (Entschluss): Luchte takes the term from Heidegger’s perhaps ironic remark on his philosophizing in a 1936 letter to Jaspers and turns it into a central feature of his phenomenology of original temporality and its radical temporalization of all finite thinking. It is in the protoaction of historizing “where worlds are born, where a makeshift world of binding commitments is resolved, projected as ‘there’ for the time being” (98). Nevertheless, such a resolution “for the time being” can accordingly be taken back when dictated “by the ‘matters themselves’, which as temporal, are ceaselessly calling forth new expressions of existence” (169). “However,” writes Luchte, “that which cannot be taken back, that which is beyond all provision, makeshift, is the finitude of existence, of temporality, itself [held in focus by our resolute openness, Entschlossenheit]” (172). He continues: “It is thought, philosophy, expression that is provisional, makeshift, as with that projection ‘building plan’” that is described in the Kant-book, which is destined to remain an incomplete construction site in its patchwork remakes, never a finished dwelling (172, 150). Further,

One works to remember this utter finitude of its existence and of its expressions. The indication of a makeshift is intended to point to a thinking which remembers its tenuousness, and seeks, after the example of Reiner Schürmann, a humility of thinking in the awesome face of ‘matters themselves’. (175)

Luchte says that “phenomenology as finite knowing is a ‘makeshift’, a ‘first philosophy’, each time taken up anew, never to be a possession which need merely be passed on, only to be applied” (174). This suggests (in phrases like “each time taken up anew, never … need merely be passed on”) a less tenuous or haphazard (i.e., pace Schürmann, less ‘anarchic) and more measured pulse and rhythm of temporal-historical change. This comes to us from Heidegger’s earliest philosophy, his hermeneutics of facticity, when Dasein was first identified as a historically situated I. As historical beings, we already stand in a tradition handed down to us by and through a progression of generational exchanges of a linguistic community. Factically, we have been preceded, precedented and thereby always already interpreted, and this historical life-world of precedence and tradition is the ineluctable point of departure of our own historical existence. Taking over one’s very own historical thrownness accordingly involves taking over one’s own heritage in the protoaction of proper historicality (SZ 382-4). In particular, as I mentioned earlier, it involves taking over the possibilities of one’s heritage that are adjudged to be vitally relevant for one’s own current historical situation, as inherited and yet chosen possibilities. The basic historizing action of proper historicality takes place in retracing the unitary movement of the thrown projection that is originary temporality: resolutely open for the whole of its unique historical situation, Dasein in the anticipation of its own death allows itself to be thrown back into the having-been of its factic “there”, where it takes over its own thrownness by transmitting the most pertinent of the inherited possibilities to itself, in order to be there in the timely moment of holistic insight for “its time” (SZ 385). Crucial here is the recovery of precedent possibilities that are appropriate for ‘its time’ and its generation. That is why the repetition of a tradition cannot be a rote repetition. The retrieval of precedent possibilities at once involves a re-view and re-vision of them or, in Heidegger’s terms, a countering and a countermanding to the point of a “disavowal of that which in the ‘today’ is working itself out as the ‘past and gone’” (SZ 386). The remarkable feature of this process of reinterpretation of precedent possibilities for its time is that our own past now comes to meet us out of the projected future, as our proper historical tasks (SZ 20). This feature derives from the doubly finite comprehensive horizon in which the holistic protoaction of proper historicality takes place.

From this vantage point, it would seem that philosophy is hardly a ‘makeshift’ but rather a measured hermeneutic response to the particular historical world into which each generation of philosophers happens to have been thrown, in order to ‘repeat’ (i.e., conserve: 123) the precedent possibilities that are appropriate for its time. In confronting the tradition of philosophy with his central insight of the radically finite temporality inherent in the Da-Sein experience, Heidegger discovers that the entire tradition of Occidental philosophy constituted a basic drift away from this chiaroscuro experience of be-ing and developed over the centuries into a metaphysics of permanent presence now coming to its perfection in the Ge-Stell (syn-thetic com-posit[ion]ing) of modern technology in the form of global matrixes. These include air traffic control grids, Global Positioning Systems, the World Wide Web of the internet, the starkly binary digital logic that rules informational electronics, etc. To move beyond this final upshot of the Occidental tradition of philosophy, the later Heidegger calls for a radically other beginning of thinking in accord with the history of be-ing ‘based’ on the abyssal temporality inherent in the Da-Sein experience of his early philosophy. Even in this revolutionary development in Heidegger’s thinking, one has to wonder whether ‘makeshift’ is at all an appropriate characterization of the development of this thought.

Despite its several ‘category’ mistakes, it is the merit of this book to persistently return time and again to the radical and utter finitude of existence that confronts us in the ‘event’ of our original temporality, opening as it does onto the groundless abyss of nothingness and exposing us to the awesome and overwhelming face of ‘matters themselves’.