Heidegger's Interpretation of Kant: Categories, Imagination, and Temporality

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Weatherston, Martin, Heidegger's Interpretation of Kant: Categories, Imagination, and Temporality, Palgrave Macmillan, 2002, 209pp, $62.00 (hbk), ISBN 0333994000.

Reviewed by Robert Hanna, University of Colorado, Boulder


In Heidegger’s Interpretation of Kant, Martin Weatherston closely and critically examines Heidegger’s Phenomenological Interpretation of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason--recently translated from vol. 25 of Heidegger’s Gesamtausgabe--in order to correct the somewhat one-sided impression we may get from Heidegger’s notoriously tendentious reading of Kant in Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics (also known as “the Kantbuch”). Weatherston’s interesting study is in effect a prolegomenon to the deeper and more difficult project of comparing, contrasting, and evaluating Kant’s transcendental idealism in the first Critique and Heidegger’s existential phenomenology in Being and Time.

It is well known that in the Kantbuch, Heidegger strongly emphasizes Kant’s theory of the imagination and makes the controversial claim that for Kant the cognitive capacity of imagination is the “common root” of the capacity of understanding (the faculty of concepts) and the capacity of sensibility (the faculty of intuitions). In fact Heidegger even more controversially claims that the representational spontaneity of productive imagination is at bottom identical to the volitional spontaneity of practical freedom. And most controversially of all, Heidegger also claims that Kant’s transcendental theory of the imagination anticipates but still falls short of his own existential-phenomenological theory of “temporality” (roughly, human intentional agency) and “freedom” (roughly, decisive personal commitment with a view to achieving “authenticity,” or psychological coherence and personal integrity over an entire finite human life). These bold interpretive assertions have frequently drawn the accusation that Heidegger unfairly distorts and even does “violence” to both the letter and the spirit of the Kantian texts.

Weatherston quite rightly does not try to deny that Heidegger’s reading of Kant is tendentious: it is tendentious. What he does instead, by getting deeply into the Phenomenological Interpretation-- the text of a lecture course from 1927-28--is painstakingly to reconstruct the philosophical rationale behind Heidegger’s reading of Kant by showing how it prefigures and rehearses the central themes of Being and Time, which was published in 1929. To understand all is to forgive all. In fact, Heidegger was only doing what every first-rate post-Kantian Austro-German philosopher in the early 20th century had to do or else become a mere Kant scholar or a neo-Kantian: somehow claw his way out of Kant’s system and find his own philosophical place in the sun. Frege did this in the 1870s and 80s by writing the Foundations of Arithmetic, the Begriffsschrift, and Basic Laws of Arithmetic and by undertaking to reduce arithmetic to pure logic, thus refuting part of Kant’s thesis that mathematics is non-logically necessary because it presupposes the pure intuitions of space and time. Wittgenstein did it in 1919 in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus by latching onto the elementary and non-paradoxical part of Frege-Russell logic and by substituting that for Kant’s theory of intuition. Carnap did it in 1934 in the Logische Syntax der Sprache by latching onto Tarski's brilliant semantic and meta-linguistic triage for Gödel incompleteness and the Liar Paradox, together with what was left of Frege-Russell logic, and by substituting higher-order function theory (the theory of types) for Kant’s theory of intuition. And Heidegger did it in 1927-28 in the Phenomenological Interpretation by engaging in a direct “dialogue” with Kant in which Heidegger got to do all the talking, by substituting a radically realist, externalist, noncognitive, and pragmatic version of the Brentano-Husserl concept of intentionality (which Heidegger generally labels “care”) for Kant’s theory of intuition, and by adding the existential-phenomenological theory of temporality and freedom. If this is philosophical “violence,” then thank god for philosophical violence, and to the devil with good Kant scholarship! It is however instructively ironic and grist for the sociology of philosophy that if anyone less brilliant than the Heidegger of Being and Time had written Phenomenological Interpretation or for that matter the Kantbuch, those two books probably would never have been published.

According to Weatherston, Heidegger’s phenomenological interpretation of Kant has two basic themes--(i) Kant’s logic (both formal and transcendental), and (ii) Kant’s doctrine of the imagination (especially the productive imagination)--both of which Weatherston then traces through Heidegger’s analysis of central topics of the first half of the first Critique: the nature of metaphysics as a science (ch. 1), the Transcendental Aesthetic and the unity of the faculties of understanding and sensibility (ch. 2), transcendental logic and the nature of judgment (ch. 3), the metaphysical deduction and the relation between categories and synthesis (ch. 4), the Transcendental Deduction of the categories (ch. 5), and finally apperception, objectivity, and temporality (ch. 6). Weatherston spells out the basic themes clearly and in much detail; his interpretations of Kant and Heidegger are on the whole accurate, illuminating, and convincing; and his point-by-point critique of Heidegger’s reading of Kant is similarly cogent.

Nevertheless there are still a few isolated knotty cases in which, I think, neither Heidegger’s interpretation of Kant’s texts, nor Weatherston’s interpretation of Kant’s texts, nor Weatherston’s criticism of Heidegger’s interpretation of Kant’s texts, is correct. For example, Heidegger says that for Kant “formal intuition” (i.e., formale Anschauung, not to be confused with “form of intuition” or Form der Anschauung--see Critique of Pure Reason B160-161 n.) should be understood as essentially imaginational and nonconceptual, which I think is incorrect; then Weatherston says that there is no sense in which sensibility is spontaneous, which I think is also incorrect; and then Weatherston criticizes Heidegger for failing to see that there is no sense in which sensibility is spontaneous, which I think is yet again incorrect. For Kant, formal intuition is the joint result of what in the B edition he calls (1) the “pure intellectual synthesis of the understanding” and (2) the “pure figurative synthesis of the imagination” or “synthesis speciosa,” so it is necessarily both conceptual and nonconceptual. Moreover the sensibility has its own “lower-level” or nondiscursive type of spontaneity, which thus complements the “higher-level” or discursive spontaneity of the understanding, to the extent that the forms of intuition are generated by what Kant in the A edition calls the “synopsis” of the manifold in sensible intuition, which I would identify with the “pure synthesis of apprehension” in the A edition, and also in turn identify with the pure figurative synthesis of the imagination or synthesis speciosa in the B edition.

Of course all of this heavy Kantian transcendental machinery is an attempt to answer the $64,000 question: how can the logical functions of the understanding (and in particular, categories, judgments, and empirical concepts) apply to the objects given in sensibility? Here I think that the correct answer is that sensibility is directly nonconceptually acquainted with those given objects--which are “appearances” or “undetermined objects of empirical intuition”--by means of empirical intuition in inner or outer sense, and that the special cognitive role of the understanding is then to “determine” those objects, that is, correctly characterize them by means of concepts and judgments. In other words, for Kant empirical cognition or the objective representation of the natural world is the joint product of “bottom up” lower-level nonconceptual processing by sensibility and “top down” higher-level conceptual processing by the understanding. Each faculty directly contributes its own distinctive sort of representational form and content to the outputs of the other faculty, for the overall purpose of cognizing a determinate object: so they operate interdependently. Empirical cognition is thus a global achievement of the several interdependent faculties of a single unified self-conscious rational animal in dynamic interaction with its surrounding world. The trick is to avoid the dual mistake of holding that sensibility is purely passive and that the understanding does all the cognitive work, although this is the interpretation that Weatherston favors (see, for example, pp. 17, 96-98, 104, 116-120, 160, and 174).

Also I wish that Weatherston had tried to get more deeply into the dialectical interplay between Kant’s views and Heidegger’s views. In his Conclusion he says tantalizingly that both Kant and Heidegger recognized the importance of the finitude of human cognition and that they traced the source of this finitude to human intuitional cognition (p. 176). I agree completely. But that is all he says. So his discussion raises at least two important questions: (I) Are Kant’s views and Heidegger’s views in fact fundamentally different from one another? and (II) How should we evaluate the truth of their views?

As to the first question, it seems to me that in fact there are at least four ways in which Kant’s views and Heidegger’s views are deeply similar. (1) Weatherston himself notes the obvious parallel between Kant’s empirical vs. transcendental distinction, and Heidegger’s ontic vs. ontological (or beings vs. Being) distinction (p.165). But there is also (2) Kant’s theory of nonconceptual (i.e., intuitional) content in inner sense and outer sense, feeling or affect, imagination, perception, judgment, desire, and volitional intention, which Heidegger develops at length in Being and Time under the rubric of “care”; (3) Kant’s thesis (implicit in the first Critique but explicit in the Critique of Practical Reason) of the primacy of practical reason over theoretical reason, which Heidegger treats via his doctrines of temporality, freedom, and authenticity; and also (4) Kant’s observation in the Jäsche Logic that the fundamental question of philosophy is “what is a human being?,” which Heidegger attempts to answer via the existential analytic of Dasein. Furthermore it is arguable that (1*) Kant’s transcendental vs. empirical distinction is just the distinction between humanly essential fundamental cognitive capacities (i.e., understanding and sensibility) and their actual application to the world; (2*) that Kant’s theory of nonconceptual or intuitional content is the key to understanding his theory of cognition in the first half of the first Critique; (3*) that the primacy of the practical is the key to the understanding Kant’s theory of reason in the second half of the first Critique and in the second Critique; and finally (4*) that anthropocentrism is the key to understanding Kant’s transcendental idealism in all three Critiques. Now all four of these ideas are basically shared by Heidegger. So in this light it seems to me accurate to say that the Heidegger of Being and Time has “existentialized,” “externalized,” “noncognitivized,” “pragmatized,” and more generally flattened out Kant’s transcendental idealism, but still has not really deviated in any deep way from the Kantian framework.

As to the second question, it seems to me that while there are good reasons to prefer some of Heidegger’s views over some of Kant’s, nevertheless there are even better reasons strongly to prefer Kant’s views to Heidegger’s, all things considered.

To the extent that Heidegger tries to show how logic, judgment, and conceptualization all presuppose practice, affect or emotion, and engaged intentional agency, or in other words to the extent that Heidegger tries to show how cognitive intentionality presupposes “care,” I think that Heidegger is both correct and also has gone philosophically somewhat beyond Kant. Moreover I think that Heidegger is correct that logic, judgment, truth, conceptual representation, science, and theoretical reason are shot through with normativity. Kant of course recognizes the intrinsic normativity of theoretical reason too--he holds that formal logic is the science of how we ought to think, for example, and there are deep connections between Kant’s views on truth (as formal correspondence with the actual facts) and his views on truthfulness (as sincerity and the concern for accuracy)--but not as explicitly or as fully as Heidegger.

Nevertheless Heidegger--like Nietzsche, Dewey, and the later Wittgenstein--is engaged in a radically deflationary philosophical project. As Rorty has pointed out, this project is eliminativist without being reductive. But many things, properties, and facts that really and truly matter to creatures like us are trashed along the way. What happens in Heidegger’s existential phenomenology is that logic, judgment, conceptual thinking, truth-as-correspondence, science, and theoretical reason all lose their ontological, semantic, and epistemic integrity in the face of their corresponding existential-phenomenological foundations. In effect, the logos sinks without a trace into the Lebensphilosophie. In this respect, I think, Kant’s general notion of a “transcendental deduction” (i.e., a proof that some a priori representation R has “objective validity,” or empirical cognitive significance, by means of showing how R is presupposed by some other representation R* that has objective validity by assumption) is superior to Heidegger’s existential-phenomenological analytic, precisely because--whatever we might think about Kant’s idealism--a transcendental deduction at the very least fully preserves the ontological, semantic, and epistemic status of what it purports to explain.

Furthermore and perhaps even more importantly, Kant’s basic concern throughout the Critical philosophy with rationality, consistency, truthfulness, strict obligation, and universal moral principles is a fundamental corrective to and an appropriate constraint on Heidegger’s highly subjective or first-person-centered and in effect emotivist and anti-rationalist existential ethics. The sad and sometimes tragic fact is that living freely and authentically (and even more so, attempting to live freely and authentically) in the existential sense will not guarantee that you do the right thing. This is because it is quite possible to be authentic in the existential sense and deeply evil: witness Nietzsche’s imaginary Übermensch, and (50 years later, catastrophically in real life) the wannabe-authentic Nazi thug.

This is not however to say that the Heideggerian ethics of authenticity should be rejected out of hand. Indeed, Kant’s notion of an (imperfect) duty to develop one’s talents can be deepened if one reads it as the obligation for all rational human animals to seek authenticity in the face of their own inevitable deaths. More generally, the Kantian notion of autonomy as moral self-legislation, or willing in accordance with the Categorical Imperative, can also be deepened by the Heideggerian notion of authentic freedom. Kant is surely correct that the highest good for creatures like us is to will in accordance with the Categorical Imperative: but it also seems plausible to me that the complete good for creatures like us is to have a good will, plus happiness, plus authenticity.

Therefore at the end of the day I would want to say that Kant is the much greater philosopher of the two--and correspondingly, that the Critique of Pure Reason is a much greater book than Being and Time--precisely because Kant’s Critical philosophy or general theory of human cognition, human volition, and the limits and scope of human theoretical and practical reason, comes much closer to the truth about the nature of creatures like us than Heidegger’s existential phenomenology. Nevertheless, Heidegger’s tendentious interpretations of Kant do open up some otherwise latent and previously unexplored aspects of Kant’s Critical philosophy--and this has paid dividends in recent “continentally” inspired scholarly work on Kant by, for example, Béatrice Longuenesse and Wayne Waxman. It also remains true that some of Heidegger’s existential-phenomenological insights into the human condition significantly enrich Kant’s theories of cognition, volition, and reason. So by all means read Kant, read Heidegger, read Heidegger on Kant (and here you may also want to consult Weatherston’s useful book), then read Kant again. Then throw away your Heidegger and teach Kant to your students.