Heidegger's Later Philosophy

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Young, Julian, Heidegger's Later Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 132pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00609-0.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrohm, Boston University


This vibrant defense of Heidegger’s later philosophy completes a trio of attempts to understand the philosopher’s thought. However, while helpful, it is not necessary to have read the author’s earlier studies of Heidegger’s engagement with National Socialism and his philosophy of art in order to read the present volume with profit. There are at least three central merits to this valuable study. Its first merit is its remarkably lucid style and economical structure. To be sure, this accomplishment is aided by the fact that the author, while occasionally critical of Heidegger, largely embraces his positions, thereby sparing the reader the wordy polemics that plague so many treatments of Heidegger. Nevertheless, the author manages to arrange succinct treatments of several main themes of Heidegger’s later thinking into an impressive argument. That argument brings me to the second main merit of the work, namely, its attempt to demonstrate the unity of Heidegger’s later philosophy. In the opening chapter, the author reviews how Heidegger thinks about truth and being in a manner that is at odds with metaphysics (misinterpretation of a particular horizon of disclosure as “the structure of reality itself”). In the remainder of the book, the author demonstrates the connection between this anti-metaphysical thinking and Heidegger’s cultural criticisms. In chapters 2 through 4 (entitled “The destitution of modernity,” “The essence of technology,” and “Dwelling”) the author concludes his review of the symptoms of the sickness of contemporary culture with an identification of metaphysics as the cause of modernity’s loss of gods, its violent technology, and its homelessness. In chapter 3. in particular, the author does an excellent job of explaining, in Heidegger’s terms, (a) the violence of treating everything as nothing but a resource and (b) the poetic festival as the antidote to the metaphysical picture of things that perpetrates this violence in the modern world.

The third main merit of this work is its appreciation of Heidegger’s restrained confidence in the concrete power of human thinking. This appreciation dominates the final five chapters, as the author turns from Heidegger’s diagnosis to his prescription of a therapy. The author argues that Heidegger, at his best moments, advocates a turn not from a technological disclosure of being but from a metaphysical interpretation of that disclosure, whereby everything is construed as a resource on the shelf (Gestell). There are other moments, the author acknowledges, when Heidegger – out of philosophical character and, I would add, at odds with his early conception of mathematical physics – lumps natural science (as central to the technological disclosure) together with metaphysics. But the author makes a strong case that, despite a brief and aberrant infatuation with Luddism in the early 1930s and despite a vigilantly critical attitude toward technology, Heidegger’s “turn” amounts to an abolition, not of modern technology, but of metaphysics (see ch. 5: “The turning”). This abolition, the author rightly adds, would entail dramatic, but hardly unheard-of proposes for changes in technology. In other words, on this interpretation of Heidegger “at this best,” he pursues a compromise between blanket endorsement of modern technology and retreat into a 19th-century agrarian lifestyle.

Accordingly, the author also contends that Heidegger’s insistence on the impotence of human beings alone to redeem contemporary culture does not amount to a self-absorbed fatalism, i.e., quietist resignation and retreat from activism (see ch. 6: “Fatalism”). To the contrary, Heidegger’s call for a personal turning is a manner of “caring” or, more precisely, “poetically dwelling” that fosters a turn in the world. With the aim of showing that there is far more to this fostering than a pious plea for revering things, the author elucidates what is to be cared-for (ch. 7: “The ethics of dwelling”) and how it is (ch. 8: “Being a guardian”). What is to be cared for, the author tells us, is what Heidegger deems the holiness of the fourfold: nature (“earth and sky”), humanity (“mortals”), and the gods. The author identifies two aspects of how it is to be cared-for: conservation and enabling intervention (roughly corresponding to the Greek distinction between two modes of poiesis: physis and techne). Since Heidegger addressed applications more explicitly in regard to architecture, the author distinguishes between architectural and non-architectural examples of these modes of caring-for (conservation and enabling intervention). Through elaboration of concrete examples of each mode of caring for the earth, the sky, mortals, and the gods (thus, sixteen categories of examples in all), the author undertakes to demonstrate that Heidegger’s thinking about dwelling counts as an ‘ethics’.

As one might expect, some of the examples are more convincing than others. In the case of the examples of architecture actively caring for the earth, it seems quite patent that some buildings respect their natural surroundings and even allow them to emerge in some sense, though it is less obvious that a structure designed to withstand the weather by using minimal force is somehow more expressive of the weather than a structure utilizing more force (e.g., poured concrete). Moreover, it must be added, it is hard to see how determinations of these features of architectural dwelling could avoid questions of form and function and, indeed, excursions into aesthetics that Heidegger, the anti-aesthetician, eschews. In addition, more needs to be said regarding the precise import and distinguishability of the two modes of caring-for (especially since the author countenances cases of their coincidence, see pp. 107 and 112 n.12). For example, recycling waste and protecting endangered species are supposed to be cases of conservation, but they seem to involve no less an intervention in nature than such allegedly clear cases of techne as ‘organic’ farming.

By now it should be clear that by “Heidegger’s later philosophy,” the author has in mind chiefly the writings after 1936, that is to say, after Heidegger turned away from the project of Being and Time. In the view of the author, the turn (Kehre) amounts to a “U-turn,” not a mere bend in the road, and he quotes a remark from Heidegger to the effect that Being and Time was a “dead end” and that metaphysics was still “dominant” in the work . The difference, it seems to me, is overstated. In the first place, no attempt is made to sort through the different senses and contexts in which Heidegger employs the crucial term Kehre (from the proposed Kehre to metaontology in 1928 to the Kehre im Ereignis of the late 1930s). The author’s one-denominational approach to Heidegger’s Kehre is rhetorically effective, but its sparseness is misleading. In the second place, there is the question of whether Heidegger is the best authority on these matters, whether he can give the best assessment of his development (something the author seems to assume). But even if we do indulge Heidegger on this point, he gives us ample reasons to reject the alternatives “U-turn” or “bend in the road” proposed by the author. One such reason is the later Heidegger’s continual endorsement of Da-sein as the grounding of the truth of being and his insistence on the presence of this basic insight in Being and Time, so long as the latter is not regarded as anthropology or metaphysics (see, for example, GA 66, pp. 143-146; Wegmarken 325). (Given this last remark, it is perhaps not coincidental that the author, in the course of promoting the difference between the early Heidegger and the later Heidegger, ignores the distinction between Da-sein and human being urged by Heidegger in Being and Time and in the Beiträge; we are told, for example, that the early Heidegger construes the evasion of the at-any-momentness as “a universal human disposition” and that he construes anxiety and homelessness as “structural features of human existence”; see footnotes on pp. 67 and 68; see, too, the use of the terms ‘Dasein’ and ‘human being’ in apposition on p. 45).

Heidegger gives the most complete account of the relation between Being and Time and his later thinking in the Beiträge zur Philosophie and in Besinnung, composed between 1936 and 1939, published in 1989 and 1997 respectively. This brings me to another criticism, namely, the author’s comparative neglect of these important works in which, in addition to pointing out continuities and discontinuities with his early thinking, Heidegger extensively treats a number of themes addressed by the author (e.g., truth, Seyn in contrast to Sein and Seiendes, metaphysics, the turn in Seyn, the gods and their passing-by, technology, nihilism and the destituteness of modernity) as well as several other themes that, even if treated by the author, shrink in the significance they hold for Heidegger’s later philosophy (e.g., Seyn as the appropriating event [Ereignis], the leap, the pass from the first to another beginning, the basic attunement of reticence, thinking being-historically).

As the author acknowledges, one of the most difficult aspects of the later Heidegger’s thought is the significance he attributes to gods. The author does a creditable job of identifying their role as messengers who communicate and inspire adherence to the community’s ethos by embodying and exemplifying it. But the emphasis on this aspect of gods seems to run a considerable risk of collapsing their distinctiveness within the fourfold. There are at least two issues here. First, if being a charismatic figure for the community, being its “hero,” is the central aspect of divinity, then it is difficult to see how divinity can be distinguished from social fictions or, at least, figments of social imagination. Moreover, the author’s insistence that “as heritage, the gods are always present” seems to replay a metaphysical (ontotheological) conception of the divine. In other words, on this approach the turn must take place primarily in human beings; after all, the gods are always already there and only the hardness of the metaphysical heart prevents the community from reappropriating them. But Heidegger insists that what must be thought through is not “the return of the gods” so much as “the passing-by of the last god or gods.”

The author occasionally retreats from bolder claims about an ethics of dwelling by insisting that the importance of Heidegger’s later thinking does not consist primarily in concrete suggestions about how to dwell. Instead, its genuine importance is its grounding “not in human subjectivity – in human interest, taste, or sentiment,” but in the fact that the world is a holy place, an epithet that entails the obligation to care for it” (121). In some senses, I have no trouble concurring with this conclusion; after all, shrines and places of a theophany clearly motivate believers to care for them. But, in the first place, talk of the holy seems to require believers whose “conversion” (Bekehrung) and thus interests, tastes, and sentiments are not incidental to the phenomenon. Again, the alternatives of discovery or manufacture do not seem to do justice to Heidegger’s account. In the second place, talk of the holy seems clearly to commit us to the possibility of the unholy and, if we are to avoid being swept up into the fanatical fervor often attached to such epithets, we must be able to discriminate between the ethical and the unethical. If the grounding that Heidegger allegedly gives to ethics cannot provide principles for this discrimination, e.g., for determining that certain courses of action are generally right and some even enforcibly so, then talk about an “ethics of dwelling” seems to be a bit of hyperbole. Conspicuously absent from the author’s account of Heidegger’s ethics is any consideration of matters of justice, and it is difficult to see how something “counts” as ethics if it lacks an account of justice – not to be confused with love of neighbor (“the salient characteristic in Heidegger’s portrait of the dweller,” according to the author). Can the moral legitimacy of capital punishment be determined in terms of the categories of conservation, techne, or love? According to the ethics of dwelling, is some genetic engineering a form of enabling interference, i.e., an ethical rather than unethical techne? The alternatives here are not the development of a basic mood of dwelling versus completion of “a twenty-point eco-plan”; something further is necessary for an ethics, namely, a linking of that basic mood with a basic understanding/projection of living with the fourfold, an understanding that contains guidelines – not least jurisprudential guidelines, not to be confused with “algorithms” – for everyday dwelling. Particularly revealing in this regard is the fact that – after identifying Heidegger’s as an ethics of action and before reviling those who construe ethics as a set of algorithms -– the author raises but does not offer an answer to the question “What kind of ethics?” (120).

The criticisms expressed in the last few paragraphs are, in my view, important, but they are also simply calls for clarification and emendation. By no means do I consider them debilitating objections to the basic thrust of this exceptional study. To anyone trying to sort through the significance of Heidegger’s later thinking, I highly recommend careful study of Young’s masterful presentation of it as an “ethics of dwelling.”