Heidegger's Philosophic Pedagogy

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Michael Ehrmantraut, Heidegger's Philosophic Pedagogy, Continuum, 2010, 196pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441109705.

Reviewed by Joanna Hodge, Manchester Metropolitan University


There is, of course, a mountain of commentary on the thinking of Martin Heidegger, and claims to open up a genuinely new line of enquiry can be only rarely made out. Nevertheless, Michael Ehrmantraut does bring into focus a new angle of entry: the question of the importance for Heidegger's enquiries of the process of teaching philosophy. This question is then narrowed down again, for Ehrmantraut does not propose to pursue the interpretation given by Heidegger of Plato's practice in general, nor yet of the famous readings of the allegory of the cave in both GA 34 (Lectures on Plato's Allegory and on the Theaetetus) and in the second set of lectures from GA 36/37 (recently translated as Being and Truth by Gregory Fried and Richard Polt). The question is focused rather on Heidegger's own activity as teacher. In this Ehrmantraut proposes to provide a motivation for Heidegger's otherwise unexplained enthusiasm for Graf Yorck von Wartenburg's contribution to a discussion of historicality, expressed in the latter sections of Being and Time (1927), and it is with Heidegger's response to Yorck that Ehrmantraut begins his study. Against Dilthey, Yorck insists on the ontological status and futural orientation of historicality, and Ehrmantraut shows Heidegger seizing on the notion of historicality as a virtuality awaiting actualisation. That actualisation is to take place through the task of educating the next generation to take up a stance in the world as oriented towards another kind of future. In this task, philosophy in general, and more specifically the radically transformative philosophy proposed by Martin Heidegger, is to play a significant role.

The role in the enquiries of Being and Time of Dasein and Sein, of Seinsverständnis and das Man, are well enough known; those of the privilege to futurity over pastness and presentness, and to historicality over everydayness and within-timeness, less so. The stance of radical self-appropriation in the moment of Entschlossenheit, the defining moment of opening up to this futurity and historicality has been the focus of controversy for decades, at least since the decisive intervention of Ernst Tugendhat. In his magisterial Wahrheitsbegriff bei Husserl and Heidegger (1968), Tugendhat argues that the departure from a close tie between meaning, truth and expressibility in language renders the notion of Entschlossenheit otiose. This is a serious criticism; but what it precisely refuses to engage with is Heidegger's implicit appeal to future meanings, conjured into existence by that very stance which, in time, appropriates to itself both past, present and, more importantly, future conditions for meaningfulness. This very basic disagreement concerning truth is matched by a less obvious but no less basic challenge posed by Heidegger to the commonly understood notion of practice. The fallen, everyday notion of practice presumes that there is a theoretical orientation and specification of aims of living, given in advance of activity, and that there is then a subsequent turn to their practical realisation. Heidegger's proposal in Being and Time is to up-end this ordering, in line with the up-ending of the notion of truth: the practical orientation, a willingness to be put in question by being, precedes all determination of Dasein as self-questioning with respect to its circumstances, its past, its present and its future engagements. The radicality of these two moves comes to the fore in Ehrmantraut's analyses.

Ehrmantraut makes the daring move of insisting on a continuity between the orientation of Being and Time (1927) and that of the Rectoral Address (1933), in which Heidegger deploys the language of both Being and Time and Plato's Republic to endorse the newly installed Nazi regime. Heidegger is quoted to the following effect concerning Greek philosophising: 'Accordingly, it was not their intent to assimilate a practice to theory, but to understand theory as the highest actualisation of genuine praxis' (p. 3). The task of philosophy and of the philosopher is then to provide access for fallen Dasein to its genuine destiny as the source of its own meaning and futurity. Ehrmantraut takes on the task of showing how Heidegger undertakes this role of guide and teacher, whereby those guided and taught may come to understand that a certain self-violence is required in order to arrive at such an understanding. Fallen Dasein is to be brought to understand its fallenness by one who, in turn, has heard the call out of that fallenness into an understanding of the primacy of being. The move is initially thought on the model of a Damascene conversion, although by the time of Being and Time this genesis of the move has been almost completely erased. In the course of his demonstration, Ehrmantraut draws attention to the pedagogical structure of Being and Time, which works as much as a handbook in a process of self-discovery as a work of philosophical exposition. The reader is required to come to recognise his or her own self as under analysis and description and is led through a series of partial encounters, provisionally described, with circumstances in a surrounding world. This series is designed to lead that reader to a momentous encounter with futural and historical conditions of possibility for meaningfulness, converting blind destiny (Geschick) into an affirmed and welcomed fate (Schicksal).

Ehrmantraut draws attention to the pedagogical structure and function of the lectures from 1927 through to 1935 that were contemporaneous with the writing and immediate reception of Being and Time; these lectures were published in 1953 as Introduction to Metaphysics. Ehrmantraut claims (p. 16) that it is with 'What is Metaphysics' (1928) that this 'new pedagogy' comes to the fore and, in concluding his introduction, he briefly brings in the thematics of nihilism (p. 27-8) in order to underline how radically Heidegger's notion of praxis differs from that of any philosophising which seeks to found philosophy in a pre-existing model of moral and political community. For Heidegger, such a derivation would be exactly a symptom of the nihilism which arrives when the primacy of being is overlooked and some other structure, for example such moral and political community, is assigned some kind of priority. Ehrmantraut's first chapter interrogates Heidegger's notion of introducing philosophy which, unlike that of Husserl, is not a repeated attempt by the lecturer as thinker to start up the processes of assigning meaning anew but is, rather, in the mode of the one who already has insight who seeks to draw the acolyte in to share that insight. The focus here is on the 1928-9 lectures (GA 27) and those on German Idealism (GA 28).

The notion that philosophy belongs to Dasein and that Dasein belongs to being is further developed in Chapter Two, in a discussion of how Heidegger situates his students in relation to his teaching and to this philosophical programme. The students are to follow the lecturer's exposition as their teacher follows the exigencies of being. The crises of the human and the natural sciences are adduced as symptomatic of a failure of human beings to attend to the summons of being, and at this point in Ehrmantraut's startlingly lucid analysis the catastrophe of Heidegger's thinking arrives: the thought that Germany fails in 1918, in 1923 and perhaps again in 1945 because of a failure to attend to the summons of being. The elision here is one between calling German students of philosophy to pay attention to the exigencies of philosophy in a time of national crisis and calling human beings to take a stance in relation to the destiny of humanity. This interleaving permits Heidegger then to make the false substitution of the term 'the leader', Hitler, for the concept 'futurity', with truly ghastly implications. That so much learning and scholarship (Heidegger's grasp of the texts of the tradition cannot be faulted) and so much passion and energy (the enormous output of the lectures, the insight and revelation discoverable on every page) should result in so tawdry a self-delusion and such an abhorrent affirmation is both pitiable and minatory. Ehrmantraut's careful reading and sober line of analysis brings this out with exceptional clarity and rigour.

Chapter Three returns to the context of the Rectoral Address. It rehearses the notion of ontological homelessness, which is the mark of the withdrawal of being, and it notes the description of the struggle required to frame a reconnection to being out of this homelessness. This struggle is individual and institutional and calls for an articulation through the classical Platonic triad (the work of technical labour, the work of armed defence, and the work of thoughtful enquiry) with the intent of bringing about the suddenness and singularity of Dasein, ready for its moment. Ehrmantraut also gives a reading of Heidegger's memorial address on the tenth anniversary of the death of Albert Leo Schlageter, executed on May 26, 1923, for armed attacks on the French authorities in southwest Germany, who were supervising the disarmament after the first World War. His audience is urged to commemorate this death as bearing witness to a moment of 'darkness, humiliation and betrayal'. The languages of care and solicitude, of being towards death and of making oneself free for existence are inextricably entwined with a eulogy to this doubtful hero, much lauded by the Nazi movement. This affirmation of being brings a renewal, not of a questioning of being in a revival of philosophy, but of the German university, the German Volk and of a distinctively German destiny.

Less plausibly, in a concluding chapter Ehrmantraut expounds the manner in which such a vision of philosophy already informs Heidegger's earlier enquiries, his writings and his lectures. Clearly, the exposition of the key existentials of Being and Time cannot be shown to entail an endorsement of either Hitler or Schlageter. However, while inheritance and tradition, thrownness and projection, everydayness and authenticity, arrive all over again as in principle detachable from this philosophical ignominy of a restriction to one language, one people, one nation, they emerge as curiously anaemic when separated from Heidegger's overwhelming and thoroughly misguided image of himself as saviour of a German nation. Ehrmantraut draws attention to a certain continuity in the language between the fate, Volk and destiny of Being and Time, and that of the time of the Rectoral Address, while recognising differences of context and aim. In an Epilogue there is a rather brief account of Heidegger's subsequent attempts to extricate himself from alignment with this Nazi vision of the future in 1945 which will satisfy neither Heidegger's critics nor his apologists. There remains a haunting enigma: how does such a very great reader of the philosophical tradition, an inspired and inspiring teacher, and radical innovator with respect to the very language of philosophical analysis come to betray the most basic of pedagogical principles: from each according to their ability, irrespective of language, nation, religion? For Heidegger, the German idealist question to the vocation and essence of man becomes in these years a question to the vocation and essence of the German, and Husserl turns out to have been right all along: this is philosophical anthropology, and in the mode of a defeated German ressentiment.

As a footnote, it is important to remark that the scholarly apparatus provided for this book by its publisher is a disgrace. There is a risible index and no cumulative bibliography, so it is not easy to ascertain whether the author has, for example, consulted the highly relevant studies by, say, Miguel de Beistegui (Heidegger and the Political; Routledge: London and New York, 1998) or Iain D. Thomson (Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education; Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, England, 2005). De Beistegui's book has been widely received; Thomson's book deserves a review of its own, having some similarities of intent with Ehrmantraut's volume but ranging into the post-1945 developments. One of Thomson's key questions, what he calls the Confucian question, is whether Heidegger learns from the 'appalling misadventure with Nazism?' Such a capacity for learning would presuppose a different kind of listening to the call of conscience and to a silent insistence of being than that demonstrated by Ehrmantraut's Heidegger. Similarly, the studies of James Phillips (Heidegger's Volk: Between National Socialism and Poetry; Stanford, California, 2005) and, more controversially, Emmanuel Faye do not feature.

This strategy of writing in relative isolation from the wider controversies concerning Heidegger's work has advantages and drawbacks. The advantages are a certain focus and lucidity. The principal drawback is the lack of discussion of the uses to which these various lecture courses have been put in the vast secondary literature. This relatively short monograph would have been improved by the inclusion of a clearer preliminary orientation in terms of the trajectory of Heidegger's thinking between 1927 and 1935 and by the inclusion of some statement about whether the language of the Rectoral Address and the Schlageter commemoration, both from 1933, is indeed continuous with or constitutes an abuse of the otherwise philosophical aims of their author. This would not be incompatible with the aim of leaving the reader to conclude that a philosophic pedagogy focused on the self-assertion of a distinctively German university and German Volk betrays both the love of wisdom and the essence of truth.