Heidegger's Technologies Postphenomenological Perspectives

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Don Ihde, Heidegger's Technologies: Postphenomenological Perspectives, Fordham University Press, 2010, 155pp., $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823233779.

Reviewed by Dimitri Ginev, University of Sofia


Don Ihde dedicated his book Technics and Praxis (1979) to the memory of Martin Heidegger. Twenty seven years later he wrote:

I have come to regret that dedication … My aversion was not only because of the moral discrepancy, which does arise by equating gas chamber victims and biotechnological corn, but also because I saw that for Heidegger, every technology ended up with exactly the same output or analysis.[1]

The book under review, an impressive collection of interesting studies (some of which have been published previously), supplements the negative sentiments of aversion with a profound critique of Heidegger's philosophy of technology. The range of Ihde’s discussion is remarkable: ideas about the genesis and history of the philosophy of technology; a view about the rise of techno-romanticism; a re-reading of "the Heidegger corpus" from the empirical perspective of science-technology studies; a comparative analysis of the variants upon "autonomous technology" put forward by Heidegger, Jacques Ellul and Lewis Mumford; an explanation of the sense in which Heidegger's philosophy of technology is an existential-phenomenological enterprise; a rebuttal of the arguments for the thesis that modern technology is applied science; a search for a rationale for differentiating between handwork technology and scientific technology; and the doctrine that modern technology is both historically and ontologically prior to modern science. In handling these issues, Ihde tries to avoid appeal to representationalist epistemology in discussing science's cognitive specificity and the science-technology relationship, to replace the metaphysical meta-narrative about the "essence of technology" with a pragmatist account of science-technology, and to combine his phenomenological account of the life-world "in the midst of myriad technologies" with a multicultural diversifying of the Eurocentric story about the metaphysical trajectory of modern technology.

Before presenting the book in more detail, I should say something about the non-foundational character of Ihde's program. The author describes himself as a philosopher of technology who is neither utopian nor dysutopian. He coins the expression "postphenomenology" to refer to studies of "the extension of perceptual and bodily intentionality into the smaller and larger 'worlds' which were revealed through science and instruments."[2] Postphenomenology is the inquiry into the ways in which technologies get embodied. The Cartesian subject is replaced with a "lived body" that is immersed in technologically designed environments. In my favored formulation, postphenomenology is a continuous effort to specify Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of "fleshly interactive relativity" in terms of a (post-Heideggerian) philosophy of technology. In the book under review, Ihde characterizes his undertaking as a pragmatic-phenomenological account of the multidimensionalities of technologies. It is an undertaking guided by the assumption that humans and technologies are interrelational and mutually co-constitutive, though with regard to the issue of embodiment, the asymmetry between human agents and technological artifacts is not to be eliminated. A counterpart of postphenomenology is instrumental realism, which states that the cultural universality of technology is due to the fact that bodily perception can be embodied through instruments. Science does not make an exception. Regardless of the degree of its cognitive structure's formalization, science perceives its worlds through instruments.

Ihde's criticism of Heidegger's philosophy of technology has many foci. Two of them play a central role in the book's scenario. First is the criticism on the political-ideological level. Leaning on celebrated studies (in the first place, those of Michael Zimmerman and Hans Sluga) of the political agenda of Heidegger's philosophizing, Ihde concentrates his attention on the elements which the approach to the essence of technology inherits from the ideology of "techno-romanticism" -- an ideology that in a dysutopian fashion follows the pattern of hybridizing romanticism and technologization. The roots of "techno-romanticism" are to be traced back to the inter-war belief in a unique German transformation of technology. Though Heidegger had never shared the values of this ideology, he had accepted after the Kehre the techno-romantic theme of "Germany between the metaphysically equivalent technologizers, Russia and America". Together with this political theme, Heidegger's philosophy of technology inherits the nostalgic preference for relations typified by the handwork of a craftsman over other human-technology relations. According to the argument Ihde levels against this residual romanticism, there is no previous time to which we can return where the gathering of Heidegger's "fourfold" (earth, sky, divinities and mortals) was "authentic". The historical examples Ihde provides in this regard are highly illuminative.

Second, according to Ihde, Heidegger's philosophy of technology is burdened by a (post)metaphysical essentialism that excludes concrete, empirical studies of actual technologies. Doubtless, one can single out an impressive number of technologies that do not fit the mode of revealing that Heidegger ascribes to modern technology. Ihde's favored example is musical instruments, which do not fit into the standing-reserve/enframing scheme. But his criticism goes much further. In a nice summary, he contends that the search for the essence of technology is necessarily a reductionist turn: the growing proliferation of technologies of different types is submitted to an analysis based on a universal essentialist schematic. The fact that we are increasingly living in a "postindustrial technological landscape" makes Heidegger's critique basically irrelevant to the status quo. His portrait of the essence of technology can hardly be imposed on the contemporary electronic and knowledge-based technological world. Heidegger's depiction of the way in which modern technology reveals cannot be extrapolated to cover bio-, nano-, and info-technologies. There are many technologies, but no essence of technology. Presumably, the qualitative distinctiveness of the technoscience technologies (developed or implemented after the mid-1970s) as compared with the earlier industrial technologies restricts the validity of the main claims of Heidegger's philosophy of technology. Ihde recapitulates his criticism by stressing that Heidegger does remain in the halls of the "mighty dead" twentieth-century philosophers, but not with respect to the philosophy of technology.

Lest there be any confusion, Ihde's criticism is of a post-Heideggerian (and not of an anti-Heideggerian) sort. This is why he acknowledges significant historical priorities in the work of the thinker of the ontological difference. In particular, Ihde picks out the moments in which Heidegger was prescient concerning technoscience. Heidegger anticipates, in the first place, Kuhn's view of framework relativity as a prerequisite for approaching the historical dynamics of science-technology. The second prescient moment is the social-constructivist view about scientific practices. Heidegger is among the first philosophers who depict science as a social institution engaged in research that has the potentiality to incorporate technological aims and goals in its intrinsic development. Another prescient insight is the idea that experimental science is dependent upon progress in building technological apparatus. Heidegger's critical questioning remains insightful and penetrating with regard to the gigantistic industrial technologies that are informed by the complexity of interrelations between science and technological artifacts. Finally, Ihde makes it clear that Heidegger's existential conception of science in Being and Time (in particular, the construal of how praxical knowledge is operating in the contexts of equipment) offers pioneering analyses of technologies in use.

Ihde's critical considerations are highly stimulating. Nevertheless, the question remains whether Heidegger's prophetic depiction of "the danger" and "the saving power" would be refuted if one succeeded in eliminating the deficiencies of residual techno-romanticism and suspicious (post)metaphysical essentialism. This type of interrogation can go further. Is the conception developed in "The Question Concerning Technology" insufficiently flexible (and resistant against specifications that take into account the peculiarities of post-Heidegger technologies dealing, for instance, with genetic strands or with digitally processed and encoded information) to survive the postphenomenological attack? Is it possible to contest the validity of a conception that asks the question of technology with respect to the historicity of the ontico-ontological difference by enumerating technologies that do not fall under the Bestand-Gestell-analysis? Could "the paradigm of the Gestell" (Ihde's expression) be exposed to a direct empirical verification by stressing examples of technological artifacts that are not based on a mega-machine industrial colonization of Nature? Affirmative answers to such questions can only be given by assuming that Heidegger's questioning of the essence of technology is tantamount to questions posed by a kind of mixture of contemporary philosophy of technology and contemporary environmental philosophy. Presumably, appealing to this mixture is the only way to overcome Heidegger's essentialist reductionism. However, the "questioning" suggested is hardly equal to the horizon of problems through which Heidegger scrutinizes the metaphysical destiny of modernity.

What I am missing in Ihde's postphenomenological critique of "Heidegger's technologies" is the whole context in which Heidegger places his questioning of technology -- the context delineated by the "epochal history of Being". No doubt, several aspects of this problematic can be formulated and exposed in the language of science-technology studies enlarged by the vocabulary of a phenomenological theory of technological embodiment. Such a translation will help us to address in a "materialist-phenomenological" manner various issues of the frontier technologies in a postmodern context. This will be another "urbanization of Heidegger". Yet it will be achieved at the price of losing not only the pathos but the true meaning of Heidegger's questioning. Fortunately, Ihde opens another avenue of criticism of Heidegger's essentialism about the science-technology relationship that seems to me much more promising. He continues in this book a line of reasoning set up in several of his previous studies, arguing tht the situatedness of scientific practices and knowledge arises from the embodied character of scientific research, which implies from the phenomenological point of view an inescapable asymmetry between the human and the nonhuman.[3]

In taking up the line of reasoning regarding the incommensurability between "situatedness" and "symmetry", Ihde outlines the steps in a complex transition from a hermeneutics of the practices of scientific research to an anti-essentialist view about the reality constituted by technoscience technologies. In a first step, he addresses Heidegger's initial crypto-philosophy of technology implied by the doctrine that readiness-to-hand precedes presence-at-hand. (The concernful circumspection in the world's contexts of equipment that characterizes "average everydayness" stresses the necessity and universality of elementary technologies in all modes of being-in-the-world. By employing these technologies, there is no chance to transform the totality of co-referential contexts of equipment into a standing-reserve. All routine practices constituting average everydayness are operating with elementary technologies. The work-world, involving all possible things that are ready-to-hand, is a texture of interwoven technologies.) Analyzing this initial "philosophy of technology" put forward in Being and Time allows Ihde to argue that because scientific research is not only based upon pre-scientific readiness-to-hand, but is also characterized by its own practical everydayness (i.e., by its own readiness-to-hand) due to the use of instruments and the instrumental embodiment of scientific practices, science by its very nature is always already a technological enterprise. In scientific research there are not only thematic entities (observable and non-observable objects) that are present-to-hand, but also entities that in their instrumental use "withdraw", thereby becoming "transparent" within the interrelatedness of practices of inquiry. To draw a demarcation between these "transparent entities" and the thematic objects amounts to a highly complicated task even with regard to classical physical science.

Ihde goes on to assert that Heidegger's earlier thinking on technology (the "tool analysis" in Being and Time) proves to be superior to the later thinking characterized by essentialist reductionism about technological artifacts. According to Ihde's reconstruction of Heidegger's philosophy of technology, the analysis of readiness-to-hand prepares in a quite special manner the themes concerning the essence of technology. It also prepares, however, Ihde's own alternative treatment of the diversity of technologies without a unifying essence. Thus, we have a second step in the transition from the hermeneutics of scientific practices to a non-essentialist philosophy of technoscience. Ihde insists that a post-Heideggerian illumination of technology's specific regime of revealing-concealing in the modern epoch has to be accomplished in terms of an interplay between the present-at-hand and the ready-to-hand.

This is by no means in agreement with Heidegger, whose articulation of the essence of technology in terms of a mode of Being's revealing assigns to the technological artifacts a status that is neither readiness-to-hand nor presence-at-hand. Modern technology as revealing transcends this opposition of Being and Time. (For Heidegger, it is rather the traditional technology which is characterized by regimes of combining the ready-to-hand with the present-at-hand. Deficiencies in the functioning of this technology temporarily exclude tools from the "work-world", thereby making them entities that are present-at-hand. The notorious hammer example is a case in point.) Yet Ihde is quite successful in demonstrating that the potentiality of avoiding the danger of a total enframing and transforming Nature into standing-reserve lies on the horizon of possibilities projected by the aforementioned interplay. This leads to a third step.

This is the step of disentangling technoscience from the destiny informed by instrumental rationality and scientism. It leads to undoing the way in which Heidegger crucially connects the postulate of the ontological priority of modern technology over modern science with the claim about modern science's instrumental rationality. Heidegger's way of conjoining these two statements is continuous with the form of mathematical essentialism, which paradoxically enough characterizes the existential conception of science in Being and Time. (A domain of scientific research is disclosed by a mathematical projection of nature.) To say that hidden behind modern physics is the spirit of technological enframing amounts to claiming that the only destiny (in Heidegger's sense) of modern science is to serve instrumental rationality in conquering Nature. To oppose this view, one must emphasize that modern natural science can be the herald of Ge-stell if and only if it is governed exclusively by the standards of that objectivism-essentialism which necessarily puts into play instrumental rationality. Following Ihde's line of thought, however, we can reach the conclusion that the constellation of mathematical essentialism, epistemological objectivism, and technological enframing does not exhaust the range of possibilities within which scientific-technological research is free to orient itself.

Looking for possibilities outside this constellation is a strategy of thinking with Heidegger against Heidegger. Also at stake in this strategy is the prophecy that although a decisive confrontation with modern technology requires something similar to the essence of technology viewpoint, it at the same time must offer an alternative mode of revealing. Ihde's book provide us with good reasons for believing that postphenomenology would identify as such an alternative not the realm of art, but the forms of scientific research that, by getting rid of scientism and instrumental rationality, will foster the search for the "saving power" in a natural science that is able to think.

[1] Don Ihde, "Forty Years in the Wilderness", in: Evan Selinger (ed.), Postphenomenology: A Critical Companion to Ihde, State University of New York Press, 2006, p. 271.

[2] Don Ihde, Postphenomenology: Essays in the Postmodern Context, Northwestern University Press, 1993, p. 3.

[3] Don Ihde, Bodies in Technology, University of Minnesota Press, 2002, pp. 67-87.