Heidegger's Topology: Being, Place, World

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Jeff Malpas, Heidegger's Topology: Being, Place, World, MIT Press, 2007, 413pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262134705.

Reviewed by David Kolb, Bates College


In this significant and well-wrought book, Jeff Malpas aims to show how, early and late, Heidegger attempts to think the primal place of thought and being. The book works through Heidegger's thought but also provides an "investigation of the way in which the concept of place relates to certain core philosophical issues such as the nature of ground, of the transcendental, and of concepts of unity, limit, and bound" (2).

Malpas traces the theme of topology through all of Heidegger's work, showing its incipient presence in the earlier writings, as well as the problems that led to its becoming more prominent in his later thought.

The idea of topology as such appears only quite late and rarely in Heidegger's thinking. Yet a topological approach can be seen to underlie much of Heidegger's work… All of his work can be seen as an attempt to articulate … the unitary place in which things come to presence and in which they come to be. The place at issue here (which appears in various guises as the "Da" of Dasein, as the clearing, die Lichtung, that is the happening of the truth of being, as the gathering of the fourfold in the Ereignis) is itself constituted only through the interrelations between the originary and mutually dependent ("equiprimordial") elements that themselves appear within it. (305-6)

According to Malpas, Heidegger worried that making spatiality and place phenomenologically basic would lead to an overemphasis on objective Cartesian geometrical space. Trying to avoid this reduction, early Heidegger sees space and place as derivative from more primal features, but in his later thought he recognizes a topological and spatial "place of being" as the Event of our primal location:

that open, cleared, yet bounded region in which we find ourselves gathered together with other persons and things, in which we are opened up to the world and the world to us… . [With] a dynamic character of its own … a unifying, gathered regioning -- place is, in this sense, always a "taking place," a "happening" of place" (221).

Malpas writes in patient long paragraphs and mostly avoids or deflates high Heideggerian rhetoric. In some cases he considers alternative readings that would be familiar only to specialists, in other cases he discusses widespread impressions of Heidegger's thought.

In the chapter on Being and Time Malpas discusses public spatiality in networks of tools and items ready-to-hand, and how this connects to personal and public temporality, in partial disagreement with interpretations by Hubert Dreyfus. In this connection Malpas offers a helpful explanation for Heidegger's inadequate discussion of the human body. In the course of his study Malpas discusses insightfully the views of other scholars such as Dreyfus, William Blattner, John van Buren, Mark Johnson, and others. He also offers a pointed correction to the English place terms found in Albert Hofstadter's influential translations.

A major argument throughout the book is that early and middle Heidegger kept trying to find some other ground from which to derive the spatial. Malpas traces this to a mistaken attempt to have a single transcendental foundation from which any togetherness would derive. Although Heidegger speaks of the elements of the care structure as equally original, he still tries to derive them from temporality (itself "topological" in its coming together of three ecstases). It is the asymmetrical, hierarchical relation of what-makes-possible to what-is-made-possible that Malpas argues must be purged from the articulation of the elements or dimensions of our primal place.

Malpas contends that Heidegger abandoned his search for grounding because it failed to escape metaphysics and its subjectivistic temptations. Malpas' chapter on the "turn" in Heidegger's thought traces a gradual change to a more hermeneutic articulation of togetherness that avoids giving primacy to any one element. Then Heidegger's late notion of the fourfold describes a unity achieved through the internal articulation and interrelation of the elements that make it up without there being anything more basic that supports that unity. Spatiality and place are no longer to be derived from something more primal, but are themselves to be in the mix. As a coming together, it is a topological mix, a happening of place.

This happening opens a realm in which beings are accessible. Humans are not the agents here but are themselves opened to the world where time and space appear as abstractions from the more concrete togetherness of place. Quantifiable aspects of space and its extended betweenness emerge "from out of the single, complex opening of space that is the happening of place in the gathering of the world" (255). Even language, as "the house of being," is "something like a dimension or region (a 'precinct') in and through which we move" (264). Malpas still discerns some remnants of the earlier tendency to make the opening non-spatial even in the late thought (258), and to this extent his reading of Heidegger is corrective.

In his explication of the fourfold, Malpas handles well the elements "earth," "mortals," and the "gods." The "sky" element, on the other hand, is not treated as well, and loses its connotation of futurity, openness, and possibility. The "gods" are read as the presence in an era of the particular gatheredness of the era as such, delivering its specific modulation and character, and so as a destiny that gives a basic meaning to all beings and an ethos for community (274). This totalizing gatheredness for an era and ethos causes some tensions in the last sections of Malpas' book.

For Heidegger our proper dwelling should be "measured" by our contact with our particular primal happening. The current world is gathered by what Heidegger calls "technology." Technology is not tools or machines but an overriding gathered meaning that defines the place and context for tools -- the superhighway gathers dimensions of earth and sky, mortals and gods, just as did the peasant wine jug (234). Technology offers us a flat gathering that levels out the world, erasing the difference between distance and nearness and bringing things into the open as resources to be ordered and used. It hides things' other aspects, and in what appears to be its universal transparent place it hides its own limits as one historical gathering. "What threatens dwelling is … the loss of concealment, the loss of finitude and boundedness -- the loss, one might say of the nearness to the holy, of a proper ethos, of a proper place" (277).

Malpas summarizes Heidegger's thoughts about technology in general, but also extends them into specific features of the current world, roughly the neo-liberal consumerism and globalism that erase our attachments to native places. It is not the details of any particular economic and political scheme that are "technological," but the shared outlook that economic and political efficiency are to have the final say about what is to surround us.

If there is a "cure" for our condition Malpas and Heidegger see it in a return to the richer place we can never leave, that location of all revealing of things and ourselves. This does not mean that we can create a new gathering for a new era, but we can be aware of technology as a finite revealing of beings. With Heidegger, Malpas sees the possibility of a new relation to things, and he tries to explicate Heidegger's idea of Gelassenheit in a way that allows for activism rather than Heidegger's quietism (300). He sees this activism taking up, for instance, "the importance of respecting indigenous connections with the land, or the value of regenerating local communities through the regeneration of urban parkland and streetscapes" (26), as well as other issues such as increasing accountability in universities, or preserving urban habitat and old growth forests. We need to find ways of affirming local places without demanding homogeneous and exclusive identities. This goes beyond anything Heidegger has said. Malpas explains and disputes Heidegger's own hyper-conservative politics and Nazi membership, and he makes strenuous efforts to avoid the nostalgia for rural substantive community that vitiates so many Heideggerian discussions of place.

The problem with all this is that if technology is taken as the meaning that is fundamental to our one totalizing place, there can be no way out but to "wait," as Heidegger would say, for a new Event of place. The most we can do, and it is not nothing, is to understand technology as a finite gathering, but this does not open any new world to us. Malpas, however, thinks that Heidegger has overestimated the power of technology to hide other aspects of places and things, which can even now be encountered in non-technological ways. Malpas downplays Heidegger's insistence that technology and metaphysics today are the outcome of an overriding destiny set in motion at the time of the Greeks. This leaves him freer to find in our world non-technological aspects to localities and things.

It would seem, then, that this should have led Malpas to disagree more firmly with Heidegger's "history of being" and its eras, each inflected by a totalizing meaning of being. But he still says that the Event is "the original gathering and unconcealing of things that determines all 'rationality' as such" (206). Here Malpas may be re-enacting Heidegger's early attempt to find a unified primal principle, now seen as qualifying one era's places and things.

Malpas is not talking about place as social construction but about the "place" in which social construction might happen. But Malpas needs to do more to situate his explanation of the fourfold in relation to social scientific and psychological explanations of the happening of meaning and culture and patterns of spatialization. Henri Lefebvre is mentioned but his social analysis of the "production" of space is not adequately connected to Malpas' discussion. Social construction is made secondary to the fourfold, seemingly bringing back in the asymmetry of grounding and derivation. What is needed is a further explanation of how the social construction of place relates to the play of earth, sky, mortals, and gods. Using terms from Being and Time, what is needed is either more about the relation between ontological and ontic notions of place, or more about how that distinction has been left behind in Heidegger's late thought.

If that were provided, then there might be ways to give more weight to the hopes for activism. Malpas mentions Doreen Massey's ideas, and these could be profitably brought into his treatment of the gathering of place. The always contentious social definition of place that Massey describes challenges the dominance of technology. Malpas would likely agree that there are in such social science accounts potentials for agency beyond (and in part because of) the competition among partial social frameworks. But it is unclear how these hopes for change fit into Heidegger's more monolithic account.