Heidegger's Volk: Between National Socialism and Poetry

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James Phillips, Heidegger's Volk: Between National Socialism and Poetry, Stanford University Press, 2005, 296pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804750718.

Reviewed by Hans Sluga, University of California, Berkeley


James Phillips' Heidegger's Volk: Between National Socialism and Poetry probes Martin Heidegger's engagement with National Socialism. He seeks to show that in this engagement Heidegger was motivated throughout by philosophical considerations of his own which were utterly different from the political concerns that moved Hitler and his regime. Phillips emphasizes rightly that Heidegger had nothing ever to do with the doctrines of a biological racism. He does not mean to play down in this way Heidegger's practical involvement with the Nazis in 1933 but seeks to understand it in terms of a philosophical project that extends from Heidegger's Being and Time in 1927 to his interpretation of Georg Trakl's poetry in the 1950's.

Phillips' account focuses on Heidegger's reflections on the notion of Volk, a term loaded with multiple associations that are captured neither by the term "people" nor by "nation." Even in German the word has had a long and colorful history. In its Germanic root it referred simply to a troop of warriors but by the Middle Ages it had come to mean a body of servants and then later on the common people as distinct from the burgers and aristocrats. Only in the eighteenth century did the word come to refer to a community of people held together by language and culture. As such it was utilized by Herder who conceived of humanity as a whole organically divided into different Völker. Herder was, however, a humanist who relished the manifold differences of people and assigned no specific role to the German Volk. That special use of the term to talk about the Germans was to arise in the romantic age and from there the tracks were laid to the mindless overestimation of the German people that characterizes Nazi literature. Phillips concludes in his investigation that "Heidegger's conception of the Volk cannot be extricated from his engagement with National Socialism. Its importance as a factor in his decision to join the NSDAP was simply too great. And yet its role in determining Heidegger's commitment to Hitler is an insufficient reason for identifying Heidegger's conception of the Volk with the National Socialist conception of the Aryan "type" (Art)." (p. 246)

Phillips begins his analysis of Heidegger's understanding of Volk with Being and Time where, as he recognizes, the actual term makes only a sporadic and belated appearance. But Phillips seeks to show that "in its authentic Being-toward-death, Dasein is already historical and thus, for Heidegger at least, already the historicizing of the Volk." (p. 55) That claim may need more justification than Phillips provides. Interpreters of Heidegger have long been aware of his peculiar transition from individualized authentic Dasein in division one of Being and Time to his talk about one's generation, time, and Volk in sec. 74 of division two. But no completely satisfactory account has so far been given of it. Phillips' attempt to cut through the Gordian knot by postulating the identity of historical Dasein with the Volk is intriguing but perhaps insufficiently argued. It is clear for Phillips, in any case, that Heidegger took from Being and Time "a grotesquely sophisticated receptiveness" to the rhetoric of national Socialism. (Ibid.) He concludes: "It is within the question of Being that Heidegger addresses the notion of Volk in 1927, just as it is within the question of Being that he confesses his loyalty to Hitler in 1933." (p. 5) Being and Time is, therefore, to be considered a political text, according to Phillips, "albeit political in Heidegger's sense." (p. 13) The essence of National Socialism was, as Heidegger saw it in 1933, "not an unrealized abstract ideal but rather the historical, existential thickness of [the] world that is always happening but nonetheless neglected." (p. 53) And the world so understood had also been the concern of Being and Time.

In chapter 2 Phillips turns to Heidegger's rectoral address "The Self-Assertion of the German University" where the concept of Volk makes its full-fledged appearance in Heidegger's work. Given Phillips' argument in chapter 1, we must not be surprised to read in his book that "Being and Time had not been repudiated by 1933." (p. 99) The claim is nevertheless worrying since it conflicts both with Heidegger's own later characterizations of his development and the content of his inaugural lecture at Freiburg from 1929 and essays like "Plato's Doctrine of Truth" from the same period. Still preoccupied with his initial questions, Heidegger is, in Phillips' account, simply caught up in the political emotions of the moment. "Bewitched by his own definition of the movement and assured of its superiority, Heidegger is not cynical in his opportunism. He is not even able to see his engagement as opportunistic." (p. 101) Heidegger takes the masses of the nationalist German uprising to be "the Volk of the question of Being." Concern with that question is for him moreover "the Germans' long-standing metaphysical mission", and he fails thus to see that he is expecting too much from the masses. (p. 97)

Heidegger's resignation from his rectorship did not, on Phillips' view, mark a simple withdrawal from politics. In chapters 3 and 4 Phillips lays out how Heidegger sought to transform his notion of Volk through the reading of Hölderlin's hymns. Heidegger now comes to understand Germany as "the land of the poets and thinkers because it is a land that can only ever dream of what it might be." (p. 168) Phillips leaves it open whether this can count as a serious characterization of the German identity. The course of history since 1945 would seem to discount that possibility. It is certainly not one that appeals or could appeal to a contemporary German. Phillips goes on to say that the term Volk disappears from Heidegger's later work. In his last chapter he points out, however, that in a 1952 essay on Georg Trakl Heidegger concerns himself with the term "Geschlecht" which in its manifold meanings relates once again also to the notion of Volk. The final lesson that Heidegger draws from this discussion, according to Phillips, is that "The Geschlecht, like the Volk, is missing, but only as such can it constitute human community." (p. 245) Dasein, Volk, and Geschlecht must therefore all be understood to belong to a metaphysics of absence which Phillips identifies at the heart of Heidegger's entire philosophical enterprise.

Throughout his book Phillips displays admirable familiarity with Heidegger's writings. He is also well acquainted with the secondary literature as he shows in a series of mostly critical remarks. His book is marred somewhat by his adoption of a fashionable post-modern jargon that often obscures his meaning and sometimes appears utterly meaningless as in the following passage from page 241: "Trakl's singular poem decays into discrete verses. It falls away from itself in becoming the extant work. Decay is by no means unilateral: the verses decay toward the singular poem and the singular poem decays towards the verses. Or again, the singular poem is decay itself. The composed is a decomposition of decomposition." Brrr!