Heidegger's Way of Being

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Richard Capobianco, Heidegger's Way of Being, University of Toronto Press, 2014, 122pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442649637.

Reviewed by S. Montgomery Ewegen, Trinity College


This book presents an eloquent and compelling case that Heidegger's life-long philosophical task, from his earliest texts to his latest, was the elucidation and articulation of Being understood as manifestation. To demonstrate that this is so, Richard Capobianco analyses various texts ranging from 1919 to 1976 (many of which have yet to be translated into English) in which Heidegger's preoccupation with Being's manifestation, rather than with the human being's meaning-making activity, is made clear. Despite the many different names that Heidegger employed to articulate such manifestation -- physis, aletheia, Logos, hen, Ereignis, Lichthung, Gegend, Es Gibt -- Capobianco capably demonstrates that each of these terms more or less 'says the same,' and that Being's manifestation thus remained Heidegger's principle and enduring concern. This small book, totaling just under 100 pages, reads like a series of fugues, each chapter repeating in new registers and with subtle and substantive variation the same aforementioned theme. In many ways, this book is a continuation of Capobianco's previous work, Engaging Heidegger; however, it also stands perfectly well on its own as an interesting and insightful contribution to Heidegger studies.

Contrary to certain prevalent trends within contemporary scholarship, Capobianco argues that Being (understood as manifestation, presencing, etc.) was always for Heidegger 'structurally prior' to human meaning (5), and much evidence is adduced to demonstrate this point. (More is said throughout the book, and especially in Chapter Six, about the character of such 'priority.') Though this book has little chance of bringing the debate surrounding this issue to an end, it presents as strong a case as is possible in favor of the view that Heidegger's interest was always primarily with Being itself as prior to, and to a great extent independent of, human beings.

In Chapter One, Capobianco shows that as early as 1919 (in GA 56/57) Heidegger's interest was already focused on Being as the manifestation of things, rather than on the human activity of meaning-making that belongs structurally to our conscious experience. This interest continued to solidify into the 20s and 30s, and is (according to Capobianco) most evident in Heidegger's works on Aristotle from that period. Even in texts such as Being and Time (1927), in which one perhaps sees Heidegger most expressly engaged in delineating the structure of human experience, he was already focused more on Being's contributions to the Being/human relation. Capobianco thus provocatively suggests that the substance of Heidegger's 'turn' (die Kehre) that takes place after Being and Time was already present as early as 1919, and that, therefore, Heidegger's later term 'the truth of Being' says nothing other than the expression 'the meaning of being' that one finds in his earlier works (16). Both expressions, and thus both early and late Heidegger, are attempting to articulate "the manifestness of Being and its relation to the human being" (16; his italics). Capobianco proceeds to argue convincingly that the later terms Ereignis, Lichtung, and Es Gibt "say the same" as Being, and are not, therefore, structurally prior to Being as some commentators have suggested (94). Above all, this chapter demonstrates that, despite the many different ways Heidegger attempts to say Being, his philosophical focus remained, from beginning to end, "the pure appropriating . . . of what appears (beings) in the fullness of appearing (beingness)" (23); in other words, Being's 'manifestive' activity.

In Chapter Two, Capobianco analyzes Heidegger's reflections from 1970 on Hölderlin's poem 'Autumn,' arguing that the poem accomplishes the very process with which Heidegger was so enduringly concerned: manifestation itself. In the poem, Being is spoken of in terms of "nature's gleaming," that is, the process by which Being, understood as nature (the Greek physis), lets beings come to presence. Perhaps most significantly, Capobianco here argues that even in these reflections from 1970 one can see Heidegger employing the conceptuality, though not the actual language, of 'the ontological difference' (30-31), a concept often thought to have been abandoned by the later Heidegger. Heidegger's employment of this difference at such a late date further indicates continuity between his early and later thought, a continuity essential to Capobianco's thesis.

Chapter 3 begins with an analysis of Time and Being (1962) in which Heidegger emphasizes the 'letting' character of Being. As Capobianco shows, this emphasis does not indicate a fundamental shift in his thinking (as is sometimes thought), but shows yet another attempt to reorient our attention away from present entities and our engagement with them toward the process of coming-to-presence itself (40). Thus, yet another text (now from the 1960s) indicates that, for Heidegger, "the manifestness of Being is structurally prior to Dasein's manifestive activity" (41). This chapter further argues that Being, as structurally prior, exceeds and is irreducible to the meanings we derive from it.

The rest of Chapter 3 analyses Heidegger's understanding of the Greek term physis as the naming of this resplendent excess, focusing on his still un-translated text "On the Islands of the Aegean" (GA 75). According to Heidegger, the early Greeks related to physis (nature) with much more 'immediacy' than do moderns, and thus bore a more immediate relation to Being (as emerging manifestation). Heidegger's aim throughout this text is to reawaken the human being, cut off from physis by modern subjectivism and its descendants, to the overflowing emergency of Being. Although every human being as such (according to Capobianco) is capable of being awakened to this excess (49), it is principally the poets who, for Heidegger, are capable of seeing and responding to this radiant gleaming as it shines through all things (48).

In Chapter Four, Capobianco returns to certain key texts from the 1930s in order to demonstrate that Heidegger, even in these early texts, thought Being in terms of physis and aletheia, and that the Heidegger of the 1930s thus continued to grant a "structural antecedence" to physis (and therefore to Being) (53). The bulk of the chapter focuses on Introduction to Metaphysics (1935), which Capobianco considers to be "the clearest and most compelling statement on Being that Heidegger ever composed" (57). In this text, one finds Heidegger thinking Being in terms of the Greek experience of physis as "the prevailing of what prevails" (58), and a further aligning of physis, aletheia, and Being. (As Heidegger unqualifiedly states: "Physis is Being itself.") Physis, as that wherein beings come to stand, is that which lets all beings show themselves in their self-showing as the beings that they are. As an example of such self-showing, Capobianco concludes the chapter with a beautiful description of Boston Harbor in October, where one might see, among other things, the ocean and the sky as well as human beings and all of their various human contrivances.

Chapter Five begins with a meditation on a sculpture of a Tequesta 'sentinel' at the mouth of the Miami River in Florida, a sculpture which Capobianco sees as heralding, in a manner that is more than metaphorical, Being's manifestation. He then turns to an analysis of Heidegger's 1944 lecture course on Heraclitus, "The Inception of Western Thinking" (GA 55). Capobianco capably demonstrates that, for Heidegger, the early Greeks experienced Being as pure emerging, giving this emerging the various names physis, zoe, and aletheia. Through a close reading of Heidegger's treatment of several of Heraclitus's fragments, Capobianco again demonstrates that Being, as physis/aletheia, is 'prior' to the human being's meaning-making activity; and, while certain scholars might quibble with Capobianco about what the precise nature of this priority is, it is made unassailably clear that, for Heidegger, there was indeed such a priority. The chapter concludes with a fascinating analysis of Heidegger's difficult meditations on signs (Zeichen) and language as they relate to Being.

Chapter Six continues the analysis of Heidegger's lectures on Heraclitus, focusing now on the 1944 lectures on Logos. Capobianco's short but incisive analysis demonstrates incontrovertibly that within this lecture course Heidegger understood Logos, as the primordial fore-gathering whereby beings come to presence, to be an operation antecedent to, and thereby structurally independent of, any human activity (85). This chapter further indicates the extent to which Heidegger understood Logos, aletheia, and physis to all name, in different registers, the same process: namely, Being itself as manifestation.

Overall, this book is outstanding in its rigor and attentiveness to Heidegger's subtlety, and Capobianco makes an adamantine case in favor of his thesis. In the spirit of scholarly conversation, however, I will mention three issues that arose for me throughout reading this book: the first pertaining to a mater of form, the second and third to more philosophically substantial concerns.

From the outset, this book sets itself against other commentators who have argued that 'meaning' and 'meaning-making,' rather than Being itself, had remained Heidegger's foremost philosophical focus. Capobianco makes a compelling and clear case that such commentators have missed the extent to which Heidegger, throughout his career, gave priority to Being (as "the temporal-spatial emerging and shining-forth of beings in their beingness" (7)) over the meaning-making activities of the human being. However, given that Capobianco intends his book as a corrective to what he sees as a flawed perspective within Heidegger scholarship (and a regrettable 'forgetfulness of being' that accompanies this perspective), the book would have benefited from a more direct and sustained engagement with the work of those scholars who hold this perspective. As is, his engagement with other scholarship takes place almost entirely within footnotes, and even then rather cursorily. However, though a more direct interaction with these scholars would have served to make Capobianco's own relation to them clearer, it doubtlessly would also have detracted from his own close textual analyses of Heidegger's works and disrupted the rhythm of this smoothly flowing book. Thus, even without this more explicit engagement with the work of these scholars, Capobianco's book nonetheless remains strong in its own right.

The second issue pertains to Capobianco's understanding of poetry -- or, rather, to his use of it. Throughout his book -- indeed, from its very epigram -- Capobianco adduces the work of various poets as evidence of the poet's ability to 'see,' and (cor)respond to, Being's manifestation. However, Capobianco almost always quotes English and American poets (such as Walt Whitman, William Wordsworth, Gerard Hopkins, and E. E. Cummings). The implication is thus that non-German poets would be capable of (cor)responding to the 'gleaming' of Being that addresses them. One wonders if Heidegger himself would have agreed that an American poet would be capable of saying Being in the way that Capobianco claims. (One recalls here the various disparaging comments Heidegger makes regarding Americans and Americanism, their rootlessness and lack of history, and precisely during his most focused elucidations of the exemplary German poet Hölderlin.) However, regardless of whether or not Heidegger would have seen an American poet as capable of responding meaningfully to nature's gleaming, Capobianco makes a seductive case that this is indeed so.

The final issue pertains to Capobianco's poetic descriptions of Boston Harbor (in Chapter 3) and the Tequesta 'sentinel' (in Chapter 5). Despite the beauty of Capobianco's description of Boston Harbor (reminiscent of Heidegger's work on the four-fold), one wonders what the Heidegger of The Question Concerning Technology (1953) and The Memorial Address (1955) -- or even the Heidegger of Le Thor (1966-69), which Capobianco frequently draws upon to make his case -- would have said looking at the same scene. Would Heidegger have thought that the motorized ferry set up for transport-on-demand across the harbor, or the wharf laid out in such a way as to best accommodate the maximum number of shoppers (offering everything from mass-produced bottled water and cotton candy to a replica of the Cheers bar), truly reveal the 'homecoming' that Capobianco has so beautifully described? Would Heidegger not have seen the wharf, rather, as a monstrous display of beings revealing themselves as standing-reserve, and the ferry as an example of humans placing on nature (i.e., the harbor) the unreasonable demand that it be 'on call' for our own willful purposes?

This question has even more force when raised in the face of Capobianco's description, at the outset of Chapter Five, of the sculpture of the 'sentinel' that stands at the mouth of the Miami River in Florida. This sculpture of a Tequesta man blowing into a conch shell, which Capobianco interestingly interprets as a heralding of Being, stands outside of a series of tall condominiums that were built on land once occupied by the Tequesta tribes (65). Given the radical transformations of the natural landscape that the raising of such condominiums required (which Capobianco himself mentions), given, too, how such material transformations themselves entailed an essential transformation in the very being of the river (from natural outlet to commercial port), would Heidegger have seen this as anything other than a demonstration of the dangerous essence of technology, a danger that, according to Heidegger, threatened to lead us to a new and fatal forgetfulness of Being? Capobianco's focus on the promise and potential of poetry to reawaken us to Being's manifestation overlooks the ways in which technology threatens to send us right back to sleep.

One result of such oversight is that Capobianco is led to make the following comparison. While describing the scene of the Miami harbor, he writes that "the giant hoisting cranes [are] bent at water's edge much like the elegant long-necked birds at a watering hole" (67). Capobianco's point is that all things are and that, insofar as they are, they all play within the temporal-spatial expanse unfolded by (and as) Being. However, one might object -- and one might insist that Heidegger himself would have objected -- that the mechanized crane stands at the river's edge in an essentially different way than does the bird. The latter lets the river be as it is, dwelling near it and taking from it only what it, by nature, can give; the former plays its part in reducing the river to a 'natural resource' by demanding from it more, always more, than it would otherwise freely give. Capobianco's beautiful description, despite its elegance, obfuscates the essentially different, and for Heidegger, dangerous way that technology reveals beings. (Indeed, one might suppose that it is this danger that the Native American sentinel signals, the danger of the impending consumerist culture come to take their land, not in the name of Being's manifestation but rather in the name of Manifest Destiny.)

Despite these issues (which are, for the most part, tangential to Capobianco's main thesis), this book remains a solid and thorough work of scholarship. Capobianco presents an almost irrefutable case that Heidegger's focus always remained Being's manifestation, and one suspects that the only way to avoid reaching his conclusions is by ignoring the evidence that he draws upon. This book will prove indispensible to anybody working within Heidegger studies, especially those interested in his work on poetry, language, and Heraclitus.