Heidegger's Way of Thought: Critical and Interpretive Signposts

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Kisiel, Theodore, Heidegger's Way of Thought: Critical and Interpretive Signposts, edited by Alfred Denker and Marion Heinz, Continuum, 2002, 272pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826457363.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


Anglophone scholarship on Heidegger is sometimes marred by its inattention to textual and cultural history. There are scholars who build an academic career on their analysis of a few sections of Being and Time without seriously investigating the process by which Heidegger composed his masterwork, its place within the world of Weimar Germany, or its relation to his many other “thought experiments,” as Theodore Kisiel calls them (29). This procedure is actually antithetical to the thought of Heidegger, who always insisted that philosophy emerges from a particular site and age; it cannot be understood ahistorically, as a sterile set of propositions. Meanwhile, some English-speaking Heideggerians of a more postmodern bent imitate Heidegger’s rhetorical and linguistic mannerisms without engaging sufficiently in the old-fashioned labor of philological research.

In contrast, Kisiel has spent nearly four decades investigating Heidegger’s thought in all its complexity and historical specificity. His magnum opus, The Genesis of Heidegger’s Being and Time (1993), is an invaluable account of this development. The present volume, Heidegger’s Way of Thought, collects a number of previously published texts by Kisiel that supplement his Genesis and will prove to be a very helpful resource for readers of Heidegger.

The first chapter, “Heidegger’s Apology,” tackles the perennially controversial topic of the philosopher’s alignment with Nazism. Employing interesting comparisons to Socrates, Kisiel provides a blend of biographical, psychological, ideological, textual and philosophical interpretations. He rightly argues that this approach does not reduce Heidegger’s thought to his life, but “allows for the freedom of both life and thought” (23). Kisiel finds some links between Heidegger’s thought and his politics: Heidegger’s “regress to a pre-theoretical abyss as the moving force of history” has a “potential for fanaticist exploitation” (31). The point here is not to condemn Heidegger for this flaw but rather to open avenues for the further exploration of a disturbing topic that, Kisiel suggests, will always be open to reinterpretation (35).

Kisiel has been an unsparing critic of the Gesamtausgabe or “collected edition” of Heidegger’s writings. The directors of the project, he claims, demonstrate “contempt for philology” (6) and “still have not mastered and truly ‘overseen’ their holdings to the degree needed to manage the publication of an archive with some degree of scholarly competence” (8). For example, Kisiel reports that, while translating the lecture course History of the Concept of Time, he found numerous errors in the Gesamtausgabe edition which had to be corrected with reference to the original manuscript (203). Furthermore, the occurrences of the term Existenz in the typescript of this 1925 lecture course were interpolated by Heidegger after the delivery of the lectures, probably during the composition of Being and Time (39). This fact cannot be gleaned from the German printed edition, for the directors of the Gesamtausgabe insist on producing an “edition of the last hand”—that is, an edition that makes no distinctions between the original text and later emendations—and an “edition without interpretation.” Kisiel denounces these principles as “devastating fictions totally at odds with Heidegger’s lifelong thought” (150). Surely Kisiel is right: a philosopher who insisted that existence itself is essentially hermeneutic could hardly endorse the ideal of an edition free of all interpretation.

As a result of the Gesamtausgabe’s editorial policies, Kisiel was not allowed to publish an index or a substantial introduction in his translation of History of the Concept of Time. The introduction is printed here (chapter 2) and the index is included as an appendix. These items alone make this volume very valuable, as History of the Concept of Time is an important text that provides an extensive discussion of Husserl and a draft of the first division of Being and Time.

Kisiel collaborated in the 1996 publication of Joan Stambaugh’s translation of Being and Time by preparing the “Lexicon” or index to the volume. His judgment on Stambaugh’s work, however, is stern: the text is “not yet sufficiently polished and equipped for use in the undergraduate classroom” (65). Kisiel’s review of the translation (chapter 3) is recommended reading for all who work with English versions of Being and Time as scholars or teachers.

Other essays here focus on Heidegger’s early development: his evolving views on categories (chapter 4), his debt to Emil Lask (chapter 5), his Freiburg lecture courses of 1919-23 (chapter 6), his reluctant adoption of the terminology of Existenz (chapter 7), and his “transposition” of Husserlian phenomenology—centered on intuition—into hermeneutic phenomenology—centered on interpretation (chapter 8). These chapters overlap to various degrees with Kisiel’s Genesis, but they are still worth reading as self-contained investigations of these themes.

The last article (chapter 9) is the earliest in order of composition: “The Mathematical and the Hermeneutical: On Heidegger’s Notion of the Apriori” (1973). Here Kisiel provides a lucid account of Heidegger’s interpretation of modern thought as “mathematical,” as presented in texts such as What is a Thing? (1935-36).

In his review of Stambaugh’s rendition of Being and Time, Kisiel quotes Henry Aiken’s remark that reading the first English translation was “like swimming through wet sand” (80). Unfortunately, one occasionally has the same experience reading Kisiel:

Accordingly, a whole referential chain of the noetic ‘with … in, to’ (nexus of intimately habitual human applying), or the noematic ‘in-order-to … for’ (nexus of applied tool handiness), where the same action within the series turns from being the to of an inter-mediate end ‘into’ the following with of means, can now come to its terminating end of closure … [71]

This passage is an extreme example of Kisiel’s predilection for packing his sentences with conceptual connections and etymological allusions at the price of clarity. Some readers may also object that his essays do not always defend clear theses, but tend to meander through a forest of textual interpretations (a style more typical of German than of English philosophical writing).

In Kisiel’s defense, one can argue that the density and complexity of his essays does justice to Heidegger’s fundamental thought: being is “inexhaustible” (198) and permanently mysterious. To distill unambiguous theses from one’s experience of being is to do violence to it, unless we constantly remind ourselves of the context and history from which such theses grow. In its less extreme manifestations, Kisiel’s style gives the reader pause in a way that is not confusing but enlightening. As he nicely puts it in a discussion of Husserl:

In a world that has already been talked over, words have been worked into things and remain impaled on things. On the other hand, by means of the proper reductive procedures, it is possible to loosen the grip that our customary words have upon things and thereby glimpse how the things themselves articulate their own structures. [99]

At their best, both Kisiel and Heidegger help us perform this difficult trick: by drawing on “the full amplitude of resources secreted in the English [and German] language[s]” (77), they enable apparently familiar phenomena to become surprising and fresh.

Some of the older essays in this volume, although they were cutting-edge scholarship when first published, naturally no longer reflect our current knowledge of Heidegger’s writings and should be used with caution. There are also occasional typographical errors throughout the volume, and some unidiomatic phrases in the introduction by the two German editors. Despite these minor flaws, this is a book that deserves to be owned by all Heidegger connoisseurs and anyone who wishes to become one.