Heidegger, Strauss, and the Premises of Philosophy: On Original Forgetting

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Richard L. Velkley, Heidegger, Strauss, and the Premises of Philosophy: On Original Forgetting, University of Chicago Press, 2011, 203pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226852546.

Reviewed by Michael Zank, Boston University


At our dinner table, when someone says, "so-and-so is a philosopher," everyone will pipe up and correct you immediately: "not a philosopher but a student of philosophy." In other words, no living individual deserves a title as lofty as "philosopher." Compared to "real philosophers" (presumably those well-known dead ones) we are all mere students of philosophy. This leaves intact, however, the possibility of philosophy. We still assume that there is such a thing. But what is it and where can it be found? Can it be found in "old tomes"? In other words, is it to be found in a kind of question that the ancients still knew how to ask and that we have since forgotten? Or is it to be found in something more immediate that is always at hand if we can only grasp it? In either case, forgetting and retrieval are inextricably linked. We cannot retrieve something that has not been forgotten, and what we retrieve will inevitably remain implicated in having been merely retrieved and not known all along. We sense the intrusion on the turf of philosophy (if there is such a thing) of something that erodes and challenges the notion of philosophy as an ideal type of knowledge or its pursuit, if by this we mean something perennial or eternal. What intrudes is history -- more specifically, the history of the forgetting of an original insight.

Richard Velkley takes this "original forgetting" for his subtitle and theme. To approach his book's heroes from the perspective of our dinner table, Heidegger is generally referred to as a philosopher, whereas Strauss is usually referred to as a critic of modern political science and exponent of what he calls "Platonic political philosophy," or more simply "political philosophy." Strauss, in contrast to Heidegger, was also a supreme ironist. And as Velkley rightly senses, despite Strauss's reluctance to engage in the language of metaphysics, he took his uncovering of the original problem of philosophy (in Velkley's Straussian formula: "the city and man") for a kind of first philosophy; "first" because it begins with what is always at hand (though perhaps obscured) and hence always the starting point of philosophy. To be sure, this gesture, elegantly and enigmatically reduced by Strauss to the formula that the truth of things is always found on the surface of things, is indebted to Husserl and the early Heidegger, the guiding stars of the students of philosophy in post-war Freiburg and, later, Marburg, among whom we find the young Leo Strauss. In a world replete with, and yet at the end of all, tradition, these young men and women learned from Heidegger to read the ancients afresh, as a source of the original question of philosophy (in Heidegger: the question of Being).

Recent work on Strauss and his circle of young Marburg associates -- a cast of thinkers that also appear in Strauss's published correspondence and included Hans Georg Gadamer, Karl Löwith, Jasha Klein, and Gerhard Krüger -- demonstrates just how much Strauss's thinking was shaped not just by Heidegger but by conversations within a "constellation" (as Dieter Henrich called this social-intellectual phenomenon)[1] for whom it was never an option simply to repeat what they had learned from their teacher, who pushed their shared insights and intuitions into sharply defined and very different directions.[2] Some of these thinkers surface in Velkley's telling, but their role in shaping Strauss's direction of thought and mode of expression remains unilluminated.

To be sure, Velkley's book is not an intellectual history of Strauss's relation to Heidegger. It is not about the relation between the two men but about a related set of problems that are central to the thought of both. Though the title suggests an equal interest in these thinkers, Strauss is always in the foreground. To use a popular Straussian formulation, the reason for this focus on Strauss is the intention to show that it is worthwhile to take Strauss seriously, at least as seriously as we tend to take Heidegger, i.e., to take him as a philosopher or as a teacher of philosophy in his own right and in the very sense in which Strauss called Socrates the teacher of ignorance. Velkley therefore wishes to persuade us that Strauss was indeed engaged in more than a string of disconnected studies on disparate subjects or thinkers, and that he has more to offer than a few sharp but ultimately preliminary (i.e., critical rather than constructive) insights.

Velkley thus joins the small but distinguished chorus of those, like Robert Pippin and Stanley Rosen, who read Strauss as a philosopher but, unlike and against these, he aims to prove that Strauss has successfully articulated the problem of original forgetting without following Heidegger into a new doctrinaire obscuring of what he had uncovered. Velkley'sprocedure is complex and subtle, based on knowledgeable close reading and careful textual interpretation. He does not pretend that Strauss was always right, nor suppress the occasional observation that Strauss may have gone too far in some of his claims, but by and large he shows extraordinary sympathy for Strauss's project, as he understands and reconstructs it. This sympathy seems, at first blush, at odds in a scholar who made his name in the study of Kant, and I cannot say that the book articulates how Velkley sees the place of Kant in the history of philosophy now that he has produced such a fine restatement of Strauss's radical critique of modern philosophy. A closer reading of Velkley than I can attempt here might yet yield an answer to this riddle.

In any case, if the book contains an answer to the question of Velkley's own position, it must be hidden somewhere between the lines. Velkley's approach is professorial to the degree that it obscures most of the author's own views and focuses on an exposition and clarification of statements scattered among the many writings of Strauss, ostensibly on many different subjects, and of course also draws on Heidegger's substantial oeuvre. The approach is nevertheless philosophical in never losing focus on the central problem of philosophy itself, that is, if it is permitted to call "philosophical" an inquiry that is mostly "textual" in that it limits itself to an elucidation of what Heidegger and Strauss wrote. This method of writing on a philosophical subject is eminently Straussian. It may well be the only thing that is Straussian about this book. Velkley strikes me as sanely distant from the ongoing Strauss wars.

As Velkley observes, Leo Strauss's intervention in the history of philosophy concerns not metaphysics but something analogous to metaphysics, namely, philosophy as meta-politics. As such, it begins with politics, or the polis, as the other of nature, but if it reinstates phusis as the subject of philosophy (something phusis was for philosophy before Socrates), it does so as the other of the city. Phusis is thus reduced to the problem of human nature. It seems to me that this reconstruction of Socratic philosophizing remains entrapped in the orbit of the city in that it generates a social type: the philosopher as the dissenter, the critic, the one who steps out of the magic circle of the opinions and shadows without therefore (and this is important) ascending from the cave and seeing the light as such. If this sounds like a strangely modern take on Socrates, that is because this focus on the philosopher-as-intellectual bears the hallmarks of its origins in Weimar, in the wake of Karl Mannheim's Ideology and Utopia, which placed the intellectual at the center of the problem of a sociology of knowledge. Strauss, who thoroughly despised and ridiculed Mannheim's approach and tried to escape his peculiarly modern marriage of theory and practice, nevertheless remained fascinated by the problem of the possibility not so much of philosophy as a discipline, but of the philosopher as a type of citizen, a man in, but not of, the city.

Oddly perhaps, Strauss also remains true to the neo-Kantian intuition that the philosophical retrieval of an original question is always and ineluctably tied to the critique of the loss of this question and hence never entirely independent of its own place in history. While Velkley realizes this historical entanglement in Heidegger, where it is eschatologically or teleologically oriented, he misses it in Strauss, whom he regards as superior in his ability to escape all historical entanglement. To be sure, this misses the obvious: that the genealogical method Strauss learns from Nietzsche is, in the end, just as beholden to its "situation" (and hence only a dialectical strike against modernity) as was the "original" philosophical question developed by Socrates, which established the supposed baseline of the "natural difficulties" of philosophizing. Yes, there's a difference in degree between the historical ballast of over two-thousand years of philosophical tradition-formation and the radical moment when Socrates overturned the pre-Socratic preoccupation with nature and "the whole" as such and turned to the city, a secondary world of human making, and to the opinions of ordinary men as the beginning of his philosophical interrogations. But is there a difference in kind?

Yes, says Velkley (with Strauss). The difference consists in the interposing of a new difficulty standing in the way of philosophy, namely, revelation. Velkley is right in realizing that this observation is central to Strauss's view of the history of philosophy, a view Strauss himself attributes to Maimonides and his Arab teachers (who interpret it in light of Plato's dialogue on the Laws). But he misses the fact that Strauss shares this insight with the circle of thinkers to whom he was close in his Marburg days, especially with Krüger, to whom he proudly reports on his newly found, rather clever formulation of the notion of a "second, much deeper cave." Why Krüger? Because Krüger, at precisely the same time (c. 1929), formulated the same idea in different terms and with an appreciation for the power of revelation, rather than, as Strauss, in a critical turn against revelation. More of a Kierkegaardian and a religious man, Krüger recognized the power of revelation to distort the unique voice of the ancient philosophers as something to be considered constructively rather than to be deconstructed. Both Strauss and Krüger recognized philosophy as changed the moment it was drawn into the force field of revelation. The circle of young thinkers around Bultmann and Heidegger, including Strauss and Krüger, all aimed for the same thing that Heidegger modeled, though imperfectly: a retrieval of the original voice of philosophy before it was distorted (in a neutral, acoustic sense of the term) by revelation. For Gadamer, also part of this circle, this became a question of method. For Strauss, it was always a question of philosophy and politics or, as Velkley points out, a question of understanding the "theological-political" problem.

For Strauss, the goal was to extricate himself and those who might follow his lead from the modern situation, a situation characterized by the turn of philosophy away from theory and toward practice and by an uncritically supposed secularization of moral ideals derived from revelation. This extrication held out the ideal of an extrication from all situatedness, represented by the term "city." Velkley clearly admires the radical thinker who holds out this possibility for "man" to pierce every illusion without thereby creating new ones. The Strauss that emerges from this reading is neither religious nor secular, neither radically evil nor innocuously professorial, but a philosopher or, more modestly, a student of Socratic political philosophy. It is a Strauss who would be as welcome at our dinner table as Velkley.

[1] See Dieter Henrich, Konstellationen: Probleme und Debatten am Ursprung der idealistischen Philosophie (1789-1795), (Stuttgart: Klett Cotta, 1991). This book pioneered a new approach in the history of philosophy called Konstellationsforschung. Cf. Thomas Meyer, “Konstellationen, Kontexte und Netzwerke -- ein Vorschlag zur Erforschung jüdischer Philosophie zwischen 1900 und 1933” in transversal  (2005): 9-39.

[2] See Matthias Bormuth and U. v. Bülow (eds.), Marburger Hermeneutik zwischen Tradition und Krise, Göttingen: Wallstein, 2008, and the recent dissertation by Stephan Steiner, Transformationen des theologisch-politischen Problems: Leo Strauss zwischen Marburger Hermeneutik und American Social Science (Erfurt, 2012), which is forthcoming as a book titled Weimar in Amerika. Leo Strauss’ Politische Philosophie (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 2013).