Heidegger: Thinking of Being

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Lee Braver, Heidegger: Thinking of Being, Polity, 2014, 234pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745664927.

Reviewed by Sacha Golob, King's College London


Readers approaching Heidegger for the first time often find the experience alternately exhilarating and stupefying. In attempting to come to grips with his texts they face a number of familiar obstacles: Heidegger's highly complex prose style, in turn poetic, incisive, and simply obscure; his tendency to assume close familiarity with vast swathes of the Western canon; the absence of any natural introductory work -- there is nothing in Heidegger's corpus which might play the role which the Enquiry or the Prolegomena do in introducing students to Hume or Kant. There is, additionally, the further problem presented by the development of Heidegger's philosophy in the decades before, during, and after the war: what is the best way to make sense of the transition from texts such as Sein und Zeit (SZ) to the later reflections on dwelling or on Hölderlin?[1] More broadly still there is, of course, the issue of Heidegger's politics and of our own reaction to it, especially after the recent publication of the already infamous Schwarze Hefte. Given these obstacles, it is enormously important for there to be an introduction to Heidegger's work that provides a clear, engaging and insightful overview of his philosophy from SZ through to the 1960s. Lee Braver's excellent Heidegger: Thinking of Being delivers exactly that.

I want to begin with two immediately impressive aspects of Braver's book. First, it is immensely readable and clear throughout: the style is engaging, direct and conversational. Braver's stated aim is to help us "not to memorize what Heidegger thinks, but to learn to see what he's showing us" (p. 31), and he frequently takes the reader through a mix of everyday examples and brief phenomenological exercises in a bid to achieve just that (for some nice instances see p. 10 and p. 31). Second, there is a fluent, rigorous and yet sympathetic coverage of many of the key themes of Heidegger's thought, both before and after the Kehre. The first half of the book, roughly one hundred and twenty pages, provides a detailed treatment of SZ, whilst the second part, roughly ninety pages, covers technology, nihilism, the history of being, and (much more briefly) aesthetics.

Braver begins by presenting Heidegger as simultaneously a phenomenologist and an ontologist:

Heidegger's work studies all the different kinds of beings there are by examining all the various ways things can appear to us, and these prove to be extraordinarily various and rich. His thought accommodates every different kind of entity, respecting the profound differences among them without trying to reduce them to a few broad principles or only one. (p. 4)

The initial discussion of "being" (Braver rightly in my opinion, avoids the capitalisation, which suggests some mystical entity, what Thomas Sheehan mocked as "big being") and of Dasein is clear and accessible. Dasein, for example, is introduced as distinctive in that, unlike rocks or animals, "Our essence is to have no essence in the sense of specific features or tasks or activities assigned to us by our nature" (p. 14) However, as Braver sees it, and I am in agreement here, Dasein nevertheless faces what he calls an "Existential Imperative", a requirement to live authentically, to face up to this basic fact about ourselves, to "uncover our distinctive nature in order to live lives more appropriate to it" (p. 24). SZ is thus simultaneously a work of ontology, of phenomenology, and of ethics broadly construed. Within this basic framework, Braver presents Heidegger as pursuing a project that is both Husserlian and Kantian: examining the way in which we make sense of the world in virtue of the specific form of our experience.

What is our awareness like? What structures does it have? What makes our clearing the way it is? This is Heidegger's version of Kant's examination of the ways the mind in a sense 'creates' phenomenal reality by giving shape to the sensory input it gets from outside, and Husserl's analysis of the transcendental subject's constitution of experience. (p. 51)

Braver's discussion of different modes of experience within SZ is perceptive and wide ranging: he notes, for example, the links between Heidegger's discussion of subject-predicate assertion and the concerns raised by both Nietzsche and Russell over its connections to a substance ontology. (One point he might have pushed further is why Heidegger would remain equally unhappy with the functional logics championed by Cassirer or Russell as alternatives). Shifting the focus back to Dasein, the second half of part one provides a clear treatment of authenticity and the wider issues of freedom and responsibility. I think Braver is exactly right here when he identifies the challenge as the need to find a balance between a problematic voluntarism on the one hand, and an occlusion of individual agency on the other: a challenge that obviously also haunts both Heidegger's later work, and the very different strands of twentieth century French thought, which he so influenced. As Braver neatly puts it after an eloquent discussion of Das Man and historicity: "Heidegger is trying to walk a tightrope between giving Dasein too much power over herself and too little." (p. 117)

Part one closes with the best introductory discussion of temporality in SZ that I know of.[2] The second half of the book deals with the 'later Heidegger'. Interestingly, Braver identifies the key turn as taking place "around 1930" (p. 135). I think this is mistaken, and one consequence, discussed below, is that it is harder for Braver to explain what is really new about the turn. He begins by presenting Heidegger as moving from the question of the being of entities back to the "far more basic fact that . . . something is manifest to us at all" (p. 137). Heidegger's account of truth, for example, constitutes an analysis of this "ever-present but ever-hidden fact of awareness, to awaken us that we may become awestruck by it" (p. 137). Braver next turns to history, both Heidegger's own and that of being. Chapter 8 provides a clear introduction to the debate over Heidegger's politics; although it is limited by the fact that the book presumably went to press before the Schwarze Hefte were available. Chapter 9 then deals with the philosophical canon read as a series of interpretations of being. Braver's treatment of the history of philosophy is excellent throughout: the remarks on Kant in part one and on Descartes here succeed in making enormously complex ideas intelligible in the same conversational style used throughout. Building on discussion of both Nietzsche and Descartes, Braver provides a superb summary of Heidegger's conception of technology and modernity. Whilst never less than charitable, Braver expertly highlights some of the idiosyncrasies and vulnerabilities of that conception. For example, as he notes, for Heidegger, in contrast with the modern environmentalists who appeal to him, "Pollution isn't the problem with technology; our distorted relation to being is what we should be concerned about." (p. 147)

Understandably with a book that covers such a large amount of complex material, there are topics where Braver's discussion is more a sketch than anything else: for example, it would have been fascinating to hear more on the relationship between authenticity and ethics. I want to close by highlighting four issues where the initial form of Braver's sketch is potentially problematic.

First, one of SZ's core aims is to argue that the tradition has either overlooked or distorted the primary ways in which we encounter the world: by extension, one of Heidegger's central goals is to offer an alternative theory of intentionality broadly construed. But Braver tells us very little about what this theory might look like, highlighting only two real candidates. The first is tacit knowledge, which is contrasted with "explicit thoughts you can explain and argue for" (p. 11). But this alone does not get us very far: even someone like Kant is insistent that the vast majority of our representations are unconscious, and there is no discussion as to why exactly it would be wrong to model tacit knowledge on its explicit counterpart. What would we falsely generalise if we did do? Conceptual content? Normative content? Something else?

The second candidate is "know how": for example when "I know how to walk" or "what honey tastes like" (p. 11) But there is no discussion of how this fits with Heidegger's text: in what sense is an a priori familiarity with being really similar to these examples? After all, animals can clearly possess 'knowledge' in both of the senses flagged by Braver (walking and honey), yet Heidegger is insistent that they lack an understanding of being or a type of experience comparable to our own.[3] Furthermore, one does not need to endorse the intellectualism of Timothy Williamson and Jason Stanley to see that in some cases a 'know how/know that' distinction is far from compelling.[4] If I know how to spell Heidegger's name, I know that it is spelt "Heidegger"; if I know how to get to my office, I know that it is the third street on the right. One underlying concern is that the best candidates for irreducible "know how" are physical skills like bike riding: by presenting Heidegger in these terms, Braver thus sets the stage for a Dreyfusian alignment of SZ with Merleau-Ponty, a trend that is deeply problematic given Heidegger's scanty and disinterested remarks on embodiment.

Second, as discussed above, Braver presents Heideggerian ontology as determined to recognise all "the different kinds of beings there are" and their "extraordinarily various and rich" modes of presentation (p. 4). Heidegger's task is thus to "accommodate every different kind of entity" while "respecting the profound differences among them" (p. 4). But if this really is Heidegger's task, he is almost laughably bad at it. Most obviously, measured by this standard, SZ is relentlessly crude. There is no real treatment there of any of the hard cases in which someone pursuing such a project would be interested: to name but a few, plants and animals, abstract objects such as numbers, sensations, universals, artworks, etc. Furthermore, the key categories of ready-to-hand and present-at-hand are both ambiguous and often carelessly demarcated: Golob 2013, for example, argues that present-at-hand is ambiguous in three key ways, whilst McManus 2013 distinguishes a staggering thirty seven non-equivalent uses. Indeed, the basic definition of 'entity' is left unclarified throughout SZ with the result that many 'hard ontological cases' cannot be well located within Heidegger's taxonomy: language is a familiar example (compare SZ: 77, 161, 165-6 and 224). Braver would doubtless respond that Heidegger attempts to fill these gaps over the course of his career, dealing with artworks, for example, in the 1930s and language later on. But it seems hard to believe that someone who was really motivated by a need to capture the rich diversity among entities would have ever begun by writing a four hundred and fifty page text that has such a restricted palette. For these reasons, it seems worth rethinking whether the initial gloss on ontology really captures Heidegger's aim.[5]

Third, it would have been helpful to clarify the cluster of issues surrounding thematisation, distortion, assertion and science. For example, Braver stresses a point that is too often overlooked, namely that SZ explicitly allows for a science of ready-to-hand entities (SZ: 361). This is important since it connects to the problem, pressed by Paul Natorp and recently treated by Daniel Dahlstrom, of whether the propositional and thematic form of texts such as SZ distorts the facts it seeks to articulate.[6] But on the crucial point of how such a science might work, and thus the implications for the self-reference issue, Braver is vague. He suggests, for example, that disciplines like economics might be a "strange hybrid" of ready-to-hand and present-at-hand "like the transitional state of the broken tool we are trying to repair" (p. 110). But how exactly is it like a damaged hammer? The most obvious reason why the broken tool has this hybrid status is because it possesses both a suspended instrumental function and a brute materiality, neither of which apply to economics (sciences as collections of theories, institutions and practices are not material in the way the hammer is, and Heidegger denies that they serve any directly instrumental function).[7]

Fourth, as mentioned above, I am unconvinced that the key 'turn' comes around 1930. One way to see the problem is this. Braver claims that it is then that Heidegger first comes to focus on the "basic fact that . . . something is manifest to us at all" (p. 137). But in what sense is this not addressed in SZ's account of disclosure? Alternately put, how are we to understand this supposedly more primordial givenness? It is striking that other theories, phenomenological or analytic, which posit a basic givenness plausibly prior to the type of account offered in SZ also tend to have commitments that are incompatible with Heidegger's own: for example, it is hard to see how Michel Henry's system should not equally apply to animals, or how 'no content' theories of perception such as Bill Brewer's could operate within the non-naturalistic framework Heidegger employs.

I have tried to highlight, if only for argument's sake, the points where I would disagree with Braver. In final summary, let me say simply that this is a superb book: it offers an elegant and insightful study of a broad range of highly complex texts. It also provides both useful suggestions for further secondary reading on Heidegger, and a number of helpful pointers regarding Heidegger's relation to later thinkers (the remarks on Foucault, in particular, stand out). It is a pleasure to read, and anyone engaging with Heidegger for the first time should do so.


Blattner , W. (1999), Heidegger's Temporal Idealism. Cambridge University Press.

Dahlstrom, D. (2001), Heidegger's Concept of Truth. Cambridge University Press.

Golob, S. (2013), 'Heidegger on Assertion, Method, and Metaphysics', European Journal of Philosophy, http://onlinelibrary.wiley.com/doi/10.1111/ejop.12018/full.

Golob, S. (2014), Heidegger on Concepts, Freedom, and Normativity. Cambridge University Press.

McManus , D. (2013), Heidegger and the Measure of Truth. Oxford University Press.

Williamson, T. and Stanley, J. (2001), "Knowing How," Journal of Philosophy, 98: 411-444.

[1] References are to the Gesamtausgabe edition (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1975-; abbreviated as Ga), with the exception of SZ , where I use the standard text (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1957).

SZ Sein und Zeit

Ga25 Phänomenologische Interpretation von Kants Kritik . . . (1995)

Ga27 Einleitung in die Philosophie (1996)

Ga29/30 Die Grundbegriffe der Metaphysik (1983)

[2] As Braver notes, William Blattner’s work, especially Blattner (1999), is the classic in depth analysis of these themes.

[3] Ga29/30: 397; Ga27: 192.

[4] Williamson and Stanley (2001).

[5] I argue elsewhere that Heidegger’s primary concern is always with questions of intentionality or meaning, of how we experience and make sense of entities: ontology enters the picture because his preferred theory of intentionality imposes a number of distinctive requirements, including that we possess a prior familiarity with the being of such entities (see, for example, Golob 2014: pp. 80-91). This gives the project a very different dynamic from one founded on a concern to fine-tune our ontological taxonomy.

[6] Dahlstrom 2001: 433-4.

[7] See, for example, Ga25: 24-26.