Heidegger's Black Notebooks: Responses to Anti-Semitism

Placeholder book cover

Andrew J. Mitchell and Peter Trawny (eds.), Heidegger's Black Notebooks: Responses to Anti-Semitism, Columbia University Press, 2017, 245 pp, $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231180443.

Reviewed by Charles Bambach, University of Texas at Dallas


What are we to do with Heidegger? The philosopher who has dominated continental thinking for the last century stands under yet another cloud of suspicion, alarm, outrage, shock, and censure. The reports came first in a torrent: from newspapers, periodicals, online forums, followed by quickly convened international conferences, YouTube videos, and now, scholarly publications. That such a crisis would come -- unbidden or no -- was inevitable. But the history of such crises helps to provide some context. Immediately after the Second World War, Karl Löwith published an article in Les temps modernes (1946) linking Heidegger to Nazism; in 1962, after German publishers refused to print them, a collection of Heidegger's political speeches as rector of the University of Freiburg appeared from an obscure press in Switzerland edited by Guido Schneeberger. By the late 1980s, works by Farìas, Ott, Derrida, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Lyotard put the scandal of Heidegger's affiliation with National Socialism front and center in academic circles. By the time Emmanuel Faye published his brutal indictment of Heidegger in 2005, most Heidegger scholars began to speak of a certain "crisis-fatigue" dominating the work of the master. What usually accompanied such crises were the reports of new findings in previously inaccessible documents, lecture manuscripts, letters, or other material. For over 40 years, the ebb and flow of this crisis mentality has been intimately tied to the shifts and leakages from the harshly controlled administration of Heidegger's manuscripts by the Heidegger family, the Schiller Archive in Marbach, the Vittorio Klostermann Verlag in Frankfurt, and by the former editor of the Gesamtausgabe, Professor Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (emeritus Freiburg).

The latest stage of this long history came with the publication of four volumes of the so-called "Black Notebooks," edited by Peter Trawny, director of the Martin Heidegger Institute in Wuppertal. In tandem with his editorial labors, Trawny also published a short book that offered a critical reading of the notebooks, a gesture that has shaped the reception and interpretation of these works and of Heidegger scholarship in general. This book, Heidegger and the Myth of the Jewish World Conspiracy (2014), has provoked its own kind of fevered reaction, and the effect of Trawny's double labors as writer and editor has yielded a new kind of crisis-mentality that has shaken Heidegger scholarship to its core. Whether one is troubled or encouraged by this plight tells us much of what one thinks of philosophy itself as a comportment and as a lived mode of questioning.

Since philosophy begins in aporia, we should, I believe, welcome this new iteration of Heidegger crisis as part of an ongoing and continuous struggle to come to terms with the meaning of Heidegger's work for our own situation. This means concretely locating such work factically in a world where democratic values about equality, justice, and freedom continue to be undermined by the burden of racial oppression, gender inequality, and supremacist dogmas that come to us from within philosophy's own history. The issue of Heidegger's racism has become the latest piece of a massive puzzle within that history. It points to nothing less than the ongoing need to interrogate the entire history of philosophy for its own imbricated relation to the discourses of oppression, ignorance, and malevolence. It is against and within such a tradition that the latest Heidegger crisis needs to be situated.

The four volumes of the Black Notebooks that have appeared thus far come to us as a new genre within Heidegger's writings. Unlike the published texts, the lecture courses, the seminars, and the correspondence, these notebooks display their own rhetorical character, their own authorial voice, and their own quirks of personality and temperament. The bulk of the entries are shorter than one page and seem written under the aura of a kind of Nietzschean self-examination: the philosophical aphorism admixed with contemporary historical observations. Though their original title was Überlegungen (Ponderings/Considerations), one might better characterize them as Klagen (complaints or grievances). In the almost 1800 pages of German text, the reader is barraged by Heidegger's carping protestations against everything from the collapse of the German university, the superficiality of the sciences, the nihilism of Christianity, the barbarism of modern culture, the dangers of Bolshevism, Americanism, and modern liberal democracy -- and, as if inevitably, we also find there a range of bitter and ressentiment-laden observations about modern Jewry. For those who have read the Black Notebooks, these remarks prove iniquitous and indefensible in any possible way. Nonetheless, they comprise only one piece of a larger landscape of Heideggerian prejudices that, I believe, need to be considered as part of his apocalyptic-eschatological vision of a modernity confronting its end.

It is against this background that this collection of essays appears. Both Mitchell and Trawny have published widely on Heidegger and have earned respect among their peers for their wide-ranging knowledge of Heidegger's writings. Moreover, in this volume they have assembled a distinguished group of contributors, half of whom are Heidegger specialists and half who address the issue of anti-Semitism as a philosophical problem of race within the larger tradition. In their "Editor's Introduction" we learn that the bulk of these essays were presented at a conference at Emory University in September 2014 focused on Heidegger and the Black Notebooks. As the editors themselves acknowledge, "the first group of articles deals with topics within the Black Notebooks and their operative contexts, the second group focuses on issues in assessment more broadly" (xxvi).

As part of this approach, Sander Gilman's essay provides a helpful account of broadly defined anti-Semitic themes within German culture focusing on topics such as the Jews' nomadism, homelessness, and rootless cosmopolitanism. Against this background, Gilman then attempts to situate Heidegger's anti-Semitism within both the history of German philosophy and within European culture at large. Eduardo Mendieta follows upon this theme by underscoring Heidegger's critique of the Jews in terms of the mathematical-economic rationalism that, as "the embodiment of the domination of calculation and machination" (43), marks them as "worldless." Mendieta goes on to argue that this leads to Heidegger's bestialization of the Jew that situates them in terms of animality. Bettina Bergo's essay, a difficult one, then pursues Heidegger's distinction between Dasein and animals by reading it against the National Socialist biology operative in Heidegger's time. A later essay by Michael Marder reads Heidegger's notebooks in terms of race, nomadism, calculation, and Marx's 1843 essay "On the Jewish Question." While showing important differences between Marx and Heidegger -- especially Marx's reading of the Jewish question in terms of national tradition against Heidegger's characterization of "international Jewry" -- Marder offers a powerful critique of Heidegger's whole approach to the question of the Jews, one that I find gets to the heart of this whole controversy about the Black Notebooks.

As Marder argues, despite his valorization of "the question" as the highest form of thinking, Heidegger fails to question his own most fundamental assumptions about the question of the Jews at all. As Jean-Luc Nancy has put it:

Heidegger could have investigated for himself the reasons and provenance of anti-Semitism. But he didn't . . . This thinker who was so adept at tracing provenances, whether those of the Greek language or those of modern (technical, democratic, calculating) devastation, did not ask himself where anti-Semitism could have come from.[1]

But we have to ask 'why'? Why was the master of philosophical questioning unable to think through the question of his own approach to world Jewry within his organizing figure of the history of being? Here I find the observations of Martin Gessmann and Tom Rockmore helpful. Both claim that Heidegger's whole approach to this question is rooted less in his philosophical interrogation of Jews than it is in his own upbringing in Messkirch and his succumbing to the clichés of rural German-Catholic anti-Semitism that goes unquestioned in his work. These clichés include the Jews' free-floating urban liberalism; their lack of attachment to soil, roots, homeland, and earth; their cosmopolitan preoccupation with the universal values of the Enlightenment; and their mercantile bent toward calculation, profit, capital, and commerce. All of these crude examples of völkisch racial thinking provide the unacknowledged pre-judgments for what Trawny has termed Heidegger's "being-historical anti-Semitism." In the recently published correspondence between Heidegger and his brother Fritz, we find several examples of this unreflective cultural anti-Semitism, where the brothers exchange trite, everyday, and banal clichés about Jews in German political and economic life.[2]

Yet the volume's focus is less on mining Heidegger's writings for their anti-Semitic clichés than it is on raising the pressing question -- "to what extent are these anti-Semitic statements integral to Heidegger's thinking?" (xx). Trawny's Heidegger and the Myth of the Jewish World Conspiracy provides the main guide for such a question and gets referenced by virtually all of the contributors. His thesis is that the Black Notebooks offer an account of how Heidegger's "being-historical interpretation of race belongs in the context of the self-unfolding narrative of the history of being."[3] Simply stated, Trawny argues that Heidegger's own distinct version of anti-Semitism was not merely part of the garden-variety racism within popular German culture or within the history of philosophy. Rather, it gets formed and emerges out of Heidegger's overall design of the history of being. This indicates that the question of racism in Heidegger scholarship can no longer be understood as a mere biographical detail, such that we might separate it from Heidegger's work. Quite to the contrary, racism lies at the heart of Heidegger's philosophical account of modernity.

The fallout from Trawny's labors as both author and editor has dramatically altered the landscape of Heidegger scholarship. We are left with an unassailable confirmation, based on telling passages in the notebooks, that Heidegger was clearly both an anti-Semite and an ardent supporter of National Socialism -- even if after 1938 he comes to subsume Hitler's version of Nazism under the same machinational categories as he does Judaism. In this collection, then, the question is not one of "saving" Heidegger from the charge of anti-Semitism, but acknowledging just how essential such prejudice becomes in Heidegger's overall account of being and its history. Hence, when Heidegger writes -- "the question concerning the role of world Jewry is not a racial question, but a metaphysical one" -- we need to situate it within his overall interpretation of a modernity whose "essence is directed toward the unleashing of the entire globe's machination."[4] In this way, Heidegger's understanding of Judaism belongs of a piece with his critique of Americanism, Bolshevism, Humanism, Nihilism, and Giganticism as different historical expressions of being's abandonment of beings.[5]

With these revelations now, finally, the legend of Heidegger's personal relations to former Jewish students/lovers as exonerating him from any charges of anti-Semitism can be put to rest.[6] Heidegger's own unique brand of anti-Semitism cannot be reduced to his biography; as "being-historical" this kind of racism undergirds his entire way of thinking and persists in it without any genuinely philosophical interrogation. It persists in its form as a banal cliché raised up to the "heights" of a philosophical argument. That is, it abides as the residue of a rural Messkirchian Weltanschauung that forms Heidegger's philosophical reading of the history of being without any real philosophical origin. What we are left with instead is a schema of Western history as destinal errancy where Heidegger's own errant reading of race helps to shape the very structure of the inquiry.

But how are we to respond to such a betrayal of "thinking" by the greatest "thinker" of the 20th century? Several essays in this collection take up that theme by responding directly to Emmanuel Faye's suggestion that Heidegger's works be removed from "the philosophy section of libraries" and placed "rather in the historical archives of Nazism and Hitlerism" and that Heidegger "cannot appropriately be called a philosopher."[7] Peter Gordon, for example, makes a cogent case for "philosophical engagement rather than forgetting." He argues that "this is the chief reason why one must reject any proposal that we banish Heidegger from philosophy altogether. And that is the major reason -- the moral reason -- why most of us will continue to read Heidegger even as we do so in full awareness that his chauvinism forever stains his legacy" (151). Like Levinas, Gordon sees Heidegger as falling victim to the same Western metaphysics of totality and "total mastery" that he elsewhere brings under scrutiny. In his assessment of the egregious anti-Semitism within the Black Notebooks, Robert Bernasconi adds his critical voice to this whole debate by challenging both Heidegger's apologists and his most ardent critics alike. As he sees it, some critics have been so vitriolic in their censure that they "seem to have willfully misread Heidegger in an effort to prove themselves more critical -- and thus more righteous -- than anyone before them" (170-171).

One comes away from reading this formidable collection with a distinct sense that the issues of Heidegger's Nazism or anti-Semitism can no longer be separated from any kind of inquiry into Heidegger's writing. In the contributions by distinguished and fair-minded Heidegger scholars such as Richard Polt, Gordon, Bernasconi, and Trawny, we find a serious acknowledgment of Heidegger's being-historical racism as something that demands both engagement and critique. And, like both Rockmore and Bernasconi, I would add that such being-historical racism cannot be sundered from Heidegger's thinking as something to be set aside or "overcome."

What emerges, then, in this helpful and wide-ranging collection is a fundamental indictment of Heidegger's anti-Semitism -- but without a wholesale rejection of Heidegger's entire work as a philosopher. As Bernasconi and others insist, what falls to us in the wake of this latest scandal is to restore "scholarly balance" (171) by bringing our criticism to Heidegger's texts themselves rather than engaging in grandstanding condemnation of Heidegger the man and the thinker. And certainly, this kind of criticism needs to be pushed farther, even beyond Trawny's own discussion of "Heidegger and the Shoah."[8] For the racism and National Socialist chauvinism that inhabits Heidegger's thinking cannot be easily separated by isolating or excising its most pernicious elements from the main body of the work. Perhaps the time is past for adopting Habermas's admonition "to think with Heidegger against Heidegger" (147, 217). Concretely, that means recognizing that the problem of anti-Semitism cannot simply be understood as rooted in Heidegger's account of the history of being as shaped by machination, giganticism, worldlessness, et alia. Perhaps we also need to interrogate the very project of Heidegger's Seinsgeschichte as itself the outgrowth of a certain racialist division of Western history. That is, perhaps we can come to recognize in Heidegger's conception of Western history not merely a being-historical racism, but a racist history of being marked by the privileging of the early Greeks at the origin and of the Germans at the end as the Volk chosen to inaugurate the turning into another beginning.

Clearly, there is much that is troubling and monstrous in Heidegger's anti-Semitic commentary in the Black Notebooks. But what is monstrous there cannot be restricted to his remarks on Jewish calculation and self-annihilation. For we also find there a brutal and vengeful attack on liberal-democratic thinking that should give us pause. There, in the wake of the postwar Allied Tribunal at Nuremberg, Heidegger writes that the "thoughtlessness" of the Western powers "exceeds by many thousand degrees the irresponsible, dreadful trade with which Hitler raged around Europe."[9] We also find there repeated claims about German exceptionalism and greatness that go beyond mere chauvinism and national pride, as when Heidegger claims that "only the German can say and poetize being in a new, originary way."[10] What emerges from the pages of these notebooks over a 17-year period (1931-1948) is a vision of Germany's vocation as the only possible hope for "saving the West." The loss of the war, the revelations about the extermination camps, the personal crises that Heidegger faces with the French l'epuration commission in Freiburg -- none of these fundamentally shattering phenomena alter Heidegger's faith in the chosen status of the Germans to save the West from an apocalyptic collapse. In all of these historical happenings, Heidegger will read Zeitgeschichte in terms of Seinsgeschichte and assign a special role to the German people.

In the wake of all this new material and these new revelations, Mitchell and Trawny's collection proves to be a valuable addition to Heidegger scholarship -- but it is merely a first step in terms of the work still ahead of us concerning Heidegger's thinking and its viability in the current philosophical moment. Finally, we are forced here to confront all of our lurking suspicions about what Derrida once termed Heidegger's "terrible silence." It is in terms of that silence that we are brought to speak about the unspeakability of what Heidegger articulates in his notebooks. In addressing these questions, however, I would argue that a critical gaze needs to be directed at our own way of proceeding as much as it does at Heidegger's.

[1] Jean-Luc Nancy, The Banality of Heidegger (Fordham University Press, 2017), 27.

[2] Walter Homolka and Arnulf Heidegger, eds., Heidegger und Antisemitismus: Positionen im Widerstreit (Herder, 2016), 29-30, 33. We find similar exchanges in Heidegger's letters to his wife Elfride.

[3] Peter Trawny, Heidegger and the Myth of the Jewish World Conspiracy (University of Chicago Press, 2015), 44.

[4] Martin Heidegger, Überlegungen XII-XV (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2014), Gesamtausgabe 96:243.

[5] Martin Heidegger, Geschichte des Seyns (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2012), Gesamtausgabe 69: 36-39.

[6] As a classical example, cf. Heidegger's friend Heinrich W. Petzet, Encounters and Dialogues with Martin Heidegger, 1929-1976 (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993), 34-35.

[7] Emmanuel Faye, Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2009), 319-321.

[8] Peter Trawny, "Heidegger and the Shoah" in: Reading Heidegger's Black Notebooks, 1931-1941, eds. Ingo Farin and Jeff Malpas (Cambridge: MIT Press, 2016), 169-179.

[9] Martin Heidegger, Anmerkungen I-IV (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2015), Gesamtausgabe 97:250. In a letter to his brother Fritz from July 23, 1945, Heidegger writes concerning the French occupation of Freiburg: "Everything is bad and worse than under the Nazis" W. Homolka & A. Heidegger, eds., Heidegger und Antisemitismus, 127.

[10] Martin Heidegger, Überlegungen II-VI (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 2014), Gesamtausgabe 94:27.