Heidegger's Path to Language

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Wanda Torres Gregory, Heidegger's Path to Language, Lexington, 2016, 148pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498527026.

Reviewed by Joe Balay, Christopher Newport University


From his early work to his late pathways, Heidegger's central question of Being is intimately tied to the question of language through which and within which Being is disclosed. For this reason, Wanda Torres Gregory proposes that to grapple with Heidegger's notion of Being it is inevitable that we should confront the question of language. The significance of this critical confrontation is made all the more exigent, however, when one observes that "Heidegger himself calls us to this task when he speaks to the importance of language in the development of his thought" (xvii).

As has been noted by other scholars, this intimacy between Being and language in Heidegger's work presents certain critical challenges. First and foremost is Heidegger's "reticence" about how to speak of the very thing that makes speaking possible (xvii). Heidegger's work is painfully self-conscious about avoiding traditional treatments of language in terms of conditions of possibility, cause and effect relations, and instrumental expression. Just as importantly, however, Heidegger's thinking undergoes a significant development from its early neo-Kantian and scholastic roots to the later historical thinking of Being as appropriating event (ereignis).

Noting these challenges, Torres Gregory approaches this task in three steps. The first is an attempt to trace the development of Heidegger's thinking of language. The second is an examination of this development from the perspective of key questions in the philosophy of language. The third is a concluding critique of Heidegger's later thinking of language, and the proposal of a biolinguistic alternative. In the following, I will offer a brief overview of these three sections of the book, before concluding with a few evaluative remarks about the project.

Comprised of four chapters, the first half of the book, "Steps in the Path of Logos", argues that Heidegger's thinking of language falls into two broad, though not mutually exclusive, approaches: (1) an early "linguistic" approach, focused on language's relationship with the "meaning" of Being, and seeking to answer how language helps contain/express the "sense" (Sinn) or "meaning" (Bedeutung) of what it means to be (xv); and (2) an "essential" approach, pursuing the question of the "essence" (Wesen) or "nature" of language (Sprache) itself. A guiding thesis in Torres Gregory's study, however, is that there is no radical "turn" (Kehre) in Heidegger's thinking of language. Rather, she argues that these two dimensions run alongside one another with the latter achieving a "slow surfacing, into explicitness over time, a move from background to foreground" (xvii).

In Chapter One, Torres Gregory argues that these broad perspectives are more precisely understood through a three-fold hermeneutics of the ancient Greek logos interpreted as: (1) the pure logos of logic; (2) the living, existential logos; and (3) the appropriating logos. At the same time, she argues that in each of these confrontations with logos, Heidegger interprets language through the Aristotelian schema of apophansis, synthesis, and phōnē. Indeed, she observes that even in this later work, where Heidegger appears to explicitly move away from the metaphysical terminology of logos, his philosophy of language continues to be shaped by this schema.

In Chapter Two, Torres Gregory explicates Heidegger's understanding of logos as pure logos in his student work (1912-1916). One finds Heidegger much closer here to the metaphysical tradition that he will increasingly come to criticize, associating logos primarily with judgment, and delineating the relations of logical meaning, psychic acts, and their sensuous expression in speech and writing. Torres Gregory observes, however, that this division is qualified in at least two ways that anticipate Heidegger's later work. First, she notes that Heidegger is influenced by Husserl's claim that the logical is always already embedded in psychic acts. Second, she states that Heidegger is influenced by the theological conception of the divine logos manifest in the living Word, a "compatible" tension that is most evident in the subsequently appended conclusion to Heidegger's Habilitation (15). Drawing these two points together, she concludes that Heidegger's earliest work already anticipates a shift toward the living logos of his phenomenological-existential period.

In Chapter Three, Torres Gregory proposes that after the student period Heidegger's work up through the mid-thirties focuses more explicitly on the irreducibly embedded quality of language in the manifest existence of Dasein, or what she calls the living, existential logos. This approach shapes, for example, Heidegger's treatment of language in Being and Time as the worldly expressedness of "discourse" (Rede). In particular, Torres Gregory argues that Heidegger's appropriation of Aristotle's tripartite understanding of logos as the assertion of apophansis, the predication of synthesis, and the expression of phōnē is rethought here according to the way that the gathering (legein) of logos makes something manifest (dēloun) by letting something be seen from itself (apophansis) in its togetherness with or as something (synthesis) via the letting-be-seen of vocalization (phōnē).

In Chapter Four, Torres Gregory contends that this structure of the logos continues to shape Heidegger's later reflections on language up through the seventies, even as he gradually moves away from the metaphysically laden term itself. Beginning with the 1934 lecture course, Logic as the Essence of Language (GA 38), she argues that logic gives way to the poetic "care of knowing about the being of beings" (GA 38, 170). Whereas in his previous existential treatment of the logos, Heidegger "defined language as a phenomenon of Dasein's disclosedness," she observes that Heidegger's later work resituates "human essence in terms of the essence of language," an inversion that opens Dasein up to the "appropriating logos of being" (36). Substituting Aristotle for the less metaphysical saying of logos in figures like Sophocles and Heraclitus, she argues that the threefold division of the logos is rethought by Heidegger here as the showing/pointing in the saying of language, the gathering (legein/Sammlung) of language, and the sounding of language.

In the second half of her study, Torres Gregory provides a series of meta-reflections on how this conception of language relates to key questions in contemporary philosophy of language. Chapter Five serves as a structural bridge between these two parts of the book as she examines more closely how the instrumentality of Heidegger's early view is rethought, first, through the expressedness of Being-in-the-world, and, later, through the appropriating essence of language itself. Chapter Six focuses on Heidegger's confrontation with traditional structures of grammar and their failure to adequately capture the originary gathering activity (legein) that he identifies in the notion of synthesis. Chapter Seven examines the semantic implications of Heidegger's investigations of meaning with regards to Being and language, and focuses, in particular, on questions of vagueness and universalism in Heidegger's thinking of meaning as it develops from its early logical formulation, to its latter worldly existential quality, to its late delimitation by the appropriating event of Being itself. Chapter Eight focuses on language's relationship with Heidegger's important investigations of truth. Torres Gregory contends that, for early Heidegger, the sensuous expression of language stands outside the realm of truth, which is determined as the logical content of judgments. However, parallel to Heidegger's rethinking of the living logos and, later, the appropriating logos, she argues that he comes to rethink truth as an event of unconcealment that fundamentally takes place in and as language.

Torres Gregory concludes her study on a strongly critical note. Focusing on the culmination of Heidegger's thinking, and its attempt to overcome what it labels the metaphysical, anthropocentric tradition, she contends that Heidegger's own position ultimately cannot escape the anthropocentrism, reductionism, essentialism, and inconsistencies of the tradition it seeks to criticize. In response to these problems, she proposes a biolinguistic model of language that purports to avoid these traps.

In evaluating Torres Gregory's lucidly written study, there is much to commend. First, it should be recognized that the book covers a lot of ground in a short space. Its three-fold division makes it at once a genealogical study of Heidegger's philosophy of language, an investigation of his thought from the vantage of key questions in the philosophy of language, and an aggressive critical rejoinder. Perhaps the most important virtue of the book is its ability to express Heidegger's self-consciously "reticent" thinking of language in a remarkably clear and coherent schema, helping to make Heidegger's challenging views on language accessible to a more mainstream analytic audience. Indeed, while the body of secondary literature Torres Gregory cites -- figures like John Van Buren, Theodore Kisiel, Robert Bernasconi, etc. -- has elsewhere adumbrated much of the genealogical story of Heidegger's Auseindandersetung with language, the concentrated, systematic focus with which she presents the material here is exceptional. At the same time, she introduces a number of interpretive theses regarding this development of Heidegger's thinking of language that are both novel and convincing (e.g. the tri-fold interpretive lens of the logos).

It is in light of these same virtues, however, that I wish to situate my more critical reflections. In her Introduction, Torres Gregory states that in pursuit of this systematic structural analysis she will largely avoid close readings of texts and key passages (xviii). While this methodological decision helps facilitate the concise, dynamic achievement that I have praised above, it seems to me that at least some close reading of key passages would be useful here in both supporting her interpretive schema and for acknowledging how Heidegger's pathways may at times resist such interpretations. This becomes particularly significant in the culminating critical conclusion. As noted above, Torres Gregory closes her study by offering a series of sharp criticisms of Heidegger's treatment of language as anthropocentric, reductionist, essentialist, circular, foundationalist, etc. These are provocative and pithy critiques, and while I am sympathetic to several of the more well-known objections here -- e.g. Heidegger's anthropocentrism -- I found myself largely unable to adjudicate the merit of the majority of these critiques due to the absence of context and textual engagement.

Let me give an example. Torres Gregory criticizes Heidegger's later thinking of language for unfairly privileging certain domains of language over others when she believes that his immanent view of aletheic language otherwise commits him to a kind of relativism. She suggests that the lines he draws are "relative at best, and arbitrary at worst" (106), and observes that:

One is left to wonder why the revelations about language that may and do occur in the other linguistic spheres, for example, profound insights that arise in everyday conversations or through scientific research and technological advances, cannot at all be genuinely disclosive in their own right (106).

Given the nature of her objection, this would be an opportune critical moment to look at what Heidegger has to say on this subject, for instance, in "The Question Concerning Technology." As is well known, Heidegger argues here that while the discourse surrounding techno-science is also aletheic, sharing its root with the poiēsis of art in technē, the tendency of techno-scientific discourse, even in cases where it appears to offer "genuinely disclosive" insights, is to operate from a predetermined framework that delimits in advance the radicality of those insights. Heidegger concludes that if the language of Being is characterized by its open aletheic possibility, however, then we should be aware of how this occluding tendency in metaphysical discourses like techno-science is more severe than in discourses like poetry and thinking.

No doubt Torres Gregory is well acquainted with this text and is likely to have a pointed rejoinder to this claim. I may even be sympathetic to her rejoinder. The point, however, is that the reader does not have the opportunity to hear Heidegger's considered position in these moments in order to assess the validity of Torres Gregory's characterizations and critiques. Put otherwise, in a text ostensibly dedicated to Heidegger's thinking of language, Heidegger is too seldom given the opportunity to speak, his voice mediated instead through the conceptual schema that stands in for it.

My last comment here is offered in the spirit of dialogue. Equally provocative is Torres Gregory's proposal of a biolinguistic alternative to Heidegger's account of language. She prefaces this by noting that Heidegger himself would be critical of any biological account of language as derivative of language's deeper "essence" (120). Nevertheless, she proceeds to argue that figures like Jakob von Uexküll, Steven Pinker, and Terrence Deacon point us to a similar evolutionary account of the human's unique symbolic capacity, but without falling into the trap of metaphysical exceptionalism that haunts Heidegger's model. She concludes, on the one hand, that "perhaps these convergences might help to question further the dogma of speciesism that prevails in both models" (127). On the other hand, she suggests that these parallels invite "a true 'communal cooperation' between philosophy and science, in which each part is open, not only to listening and learning from the other, but also to participating in a collective effort to create new ways of understanding language" (127).

Torres Gregory is right to note up front here that Heidegger would be suspicious of this biolinguistic account of language. The danger for him is that in this dialogue between philosophy and science, the phenomenological-ontological question with which he is concerned is ultimately flattened out by a philosophy of science. I agree with Torres Gregory that this need not be the endgame. Rather than turning to figures located clearly in science or the philosophy of science (e.g. Pinker, Deacon), however, I would propose that her reference to von Uexküll might lead us instead to a figure who takes the engagement between phenomenology and the natural sciences very seriously, and for whom speciesism is validated neither metaphysically nor biologically, but vigorously deconstructed on empirical and phenomenological grounds. I am speaking, of course, of Maurice Merleau-Ponty.