Heidegger's Poietic Writings: From Contributions to Philosophy to The Event

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Daniela Vallega-Neu, Heidegger's Poietic Writings: From Contributions to Philosophy to The Event, Indiana University Press, 2018, 205pp., $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253033888.

Reviewed by Charles E. Scott, Penn State University, Vanderbilt University


A new species of philosophers is coming up: I venture to baptize them
. . . attempters.   -- Nietzsche

The irreducible plurality of forms of being.   -- Daniella Vallega-Neu

Daniela Vallega-Neu engages five volumes written by Martin Heidegger between 1936 and 1941: Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event) (Beiträge zur Philosophie (vom Ereignis)), Mindfulness (Besinnung), The Black Notebooks (Schwarze Hefte), The Inception (Über den Anfang), The Event (Das Ereignis). Heidegger did not intend to publish any of them. Rather, as he moved further and further from the conceptuality and sensibility of Being and Time, he wrote them as arrangements of notes or fugues, a metaphor he uses in Contributions, of thinking-in-progress that lacked insistent, systematic goals. In Vallega-Neu's words, "Although his thoughts are grouped under a number of headings, these groupings do not comprise any representable structure. He lets go as far as he can, it seems, of any anticipatory order or structure and of representational thinking" (p. 12). In these volumes he experimented. He probed. He shifted repeatedly his emphases on words and formations of thought. As Vallega-Neu shows, he modulated the tones that composed his words and attuned himself to the different tones accompanying his language that he did not intentionally produce and that elicited new words, rhythms, and thoughts. Various shapes of thinking evoked still other thoughts. These volumes compose processes that he did not entirely possess, processes that arose, I believe, from his sense of a tantalizing withdrawing -- I could stretch proper wording and say, his sense of the tantalizing absenceing presence of life, of being: withdrawingpresencing beckoning (absurdly) in the absence of constant being (see p. ix, 7, 11-12). These volumes emerged page by page from a sense of recession from the reach of his words and the grasp of his conceptual formulations. They emerged in a vague apprehension of an immediate inception of being beyond being and the ontological lineages that formed the core and lineages of his trained thought. In these volumes something in addition to possessing and crafting happened, something not ready for the grammars and structures necessary for publication. Especially for publication under the classification of "philosophy" (see p. xi).

As Vallega-Neu presents them in this creatively conceived and original book, the poietic volumes interplay with each other as each, with varying degrees of consternation and senses of urgency, picks up themes of previous works, reshapes some of them, expresses shades of differences in direction and attunement, gives greater emphasis to or lets go of various words. The volumes often fit together with, for example, a common intention toward intensified mindfulness -- intensified meditation, that is, in, not simply on, the deepest attunements and moods he could experience in his world of thought and language. In addition to mindfulness, the volumes are motivated -- I am inclined to say incited -- by transformations of the question of being and the loss of that question as well as by the loss of being.

Vallega-Neu follows with remarkable patience and skill this struggle by a tantalized Heidegger with its many spasms, shifts, and exploratory paths. At times I looked up from her text with the thought that I was reading about the strangest and in many ways the most compelling group of novella I have encountered. They constitute a storyline of efforts by a thinker to attune himself with no thing that calls him from nowhere that is discernable, perhaps is the call of beyng (Seyn) beyond saying (or is it?). As Vallega-Neu tells the poietic story, the words and performance in these volumes unfold in a strange autobiography -- a geistige autobiography -- of an idiomatic thinker who attempts to answer appropriately a continuously receding inception, a thinker caught in, if I may put it this way, the blinding light of a dying culture and the metamorphosis of a new era in which the worst he can image happens: a pervasive sensibility develops in which people know that Heidegger's own Volk have no exclusive destiny that they could fulfill or lose. They are no more or less special than Jewish cultures or any other cultures and never have been. A new time flows in without a history of being, a Seynsgeschichte, to condemn it or redeem it.

And yet, as Vallega-Neu shows, these works are so passionate, so committed, and so original. When readers are able to use the language of the texts, they (the readers) can hear performed what neither they nor Heidegger can say directly. They can experience a world likely different from any other they have known -- probably not a world they would choose to live in, but, rather, one that nonetheless opens sites of experience and venues for thinking differently from Heidegger. Vallega-Neu reminds us that he never cultivated disciples. He, at his best, incited people to think, not calculate, not analyze, but think. Knowing this so personally and thoroughly is one of the outstanding characteristics of Vallega-Neu's authorship.

These works are, in Vallega-Neu's apt word, poietic, as distinct to traditionally metaphysical, analytic, or phenomenological. The Greek, ποίησις, means to bring forth something that did not previously exist. Or, with a different nuance and a middle voice emphasis, the word can mean something new in the world arises or happens. A flower blooms, for example, or a new thought originates.

All these volumes . . . contain Heidegger's attempts at thinking being as and in its historical happening, which he now calls Ereignis ('the event'). If and when such thinking succeeds, it allows itself to be addressed by historical being in such a way that what is articulated in this thinking becomes a site of disclosure of being in its historicality. In other words, if a saying of the event succeeds, then it is historical being itself that comes to word and not simply a representation of 'it' based on some form of subjective act or projection . . . In order to mark this more originary sense of historical being, Heidegger writes 'beyng' (Seyn) with a'y'." (p. 1. Emphasis added)

This historicality of being's disclosure -- this event of address by historical being that calls for non-representational articulation appropriate in the disclosive happening -- constitutes an issue at the core of Vallega-Neu's book. Her expositions of Heidegger's poietic work, her skill in exposing the reader to what he is saying in works that communicate primarily in their performative dimension, are remarkable in their scholarship and exactness of phrasing. She is also able to interpret what he says and what he does not say in these works with helpful references to works in the broader corpus of his publications. She interprets Heidegger's poietic thought in such a way that a reader with some knowledge of Heidegger's earlier or later works is able to understand his poietic thinking in a context that exceeds the limits of that thinking.

I note with emphasis that this book is far more than a well-conceived and articulated exposition. Chapters that are primarily expository are followed by chapters that engage the previous chapter critically. Vallega-Neu's questions, cautions, critiques, and at times strong withdrawals from Heidegger's specific thoughts and ways of thinking arise in part in her own history, her own Sitz im Leben. The horizon of a person's life-setting

is constituted in part by one's own lineage and circumstances. In my case, I was born as a German in Italy and went to study in Germany in 1985. Growing up in Italy gave me some distance from the events that stained the German people [her parents said very little about National Socialism or the Holocaust], and I began to have a more lively sense and a stronger consciousness of the effects of what happened in German national socialism only during my studies in Freiburg . . . It was later revealed to [me, my sister, and brother] that my father (supposedly) had Jewish parents and that the family hid their Jewish roots not only from the government but also from their son (my father) until he was about to get married -- this did not help with respect to my feeling of uneasiness regarding events surrounding German national socialism. I now believe that there is no solution to this uneasiness and that it must be sustained as part of one's history. I bring it up now not because I want to perform a public self-exploration but in order to let the reader be aware that I am bringing my uneasiness to bear in my reading of Heidegger, in the question of how to read Heidegger in light of the historical times in which he lived. (p. 15-16)

This reading gives Vallega-Neu's book a deepening and moving dimension in which she encounters Heidegger's relation to his own history and operative lineages from the perspective of her relation to her history and operative lineages. It also helps to define the space in which she can underscore the indelible gravity of not just recognizing but appropriating in one's reflective life the irreducible importance of forms of being. Her history, the defining lineages of German cultures, the singularities of Heidegger's life, this kind of being -- various kinds of living singularity must not be trumped by a Unity that gives all things their essence or meaning. Vallega-Neu's active awareness in this book of her personal history gives an especially interesting opportunity for her to bring to bear the importance of Heidegger's abstracting his thought from the concrete circumstances of both his immediate situatedness and the specificity of the lineages that infused his thinking and perception.

The following quote is one example of Vallega-Neu's encounter with Heidegger's limited awareness and judgment, an encounter that gives us far more than simple exposition:

Perhaps it is because Heidegger has opened so many important venues for thinking, because he encouraged us to rethink what it means to be and taught us how to think with and through experiences and attunements, that we remain baffled and speechless when he writes things in his Black Notebooks that appear to us now as shortsighted, provincial, embarrassing, tasteless, outrageous, or unacceptable. His nationalism belongs to those things, even if he writes that the Germans, the people of thinkers and poets, clearly have not found their true essence. (p 96)

She speaks of his "total blindness toward the many other lineages and histories" (p. 97). She also writes,

He was a thinker to his bones. His steadfast knowing of beyng, the greatness of his task he believed to be responding to left no space for self-doubt, no room for an incident to be just that incident. With the exception of some very few places, where Heidegger speaks of himself, he does so in view of himself as a thinker, one to whom is assigned a destiny. (p. 93)

In his sense of destiny Heidegger turned more and more away from beings (p. 101). He looked increasingly for

fundamental attunements [that] expose us to the nonhuman 'mystery' of beyng, to what exceeds human grasp, to silence, to the gods. We need to empty ourselves out, repetitively, constantly, until our bodies are no longer drawn by what goes on around us, until there is nothing left in our being, nothing there we need to expel. (p. 102)

Sounds like Heidegger needed to meditate more on Nietzsche's account of the ascetic ideal and its very destructive mischief, doesn't it!

Vallega-Neu's book gives detailed, text-based accounts of many, many more movements in Heidegger's thinking in these volumes than I can name and describe in this short review. Within this limitation I have highlighted four features of her book: close attention to Heidegger's unsystematic, experimental manner of thought; her highly nuanced attunements to Heidegger's attunements in the poietic dynamism of his writing; her connecting her history with German National Socialism with Heidegger's nationalism in the context of the central importance of beings ("forms of being") and inherited lineages; and Heidegger's increasing, quasi-religious abstraction from the world around him and the experiences that particularize that world. I turn now to Vallega-Neu's account of Heidegger's alienation in the world from the world, an alienation that is radicalized as he responds to a call -- a very special call -- that turns him away from himself in his particularity and from the tragic circumstances during the time of his poietic creations.

When thinking occurs no longer as a questioning but as a following, attuned by the silent voice of beyng, his thinking reaches a limit where there are no preconceptions to be found . . . In this saying there are not only no preconceptions but -- Heidegger seems to tell himself at some point -- 'no listener must be presupposed' (GA 71:297). Thus his thinking of the event (insofar as it is appropriated in the event of inception) answers to no one, has in mind no one. It happens, at best perhaps, freely, without why, without reason, in a middle-voice manner, and yet attuned and appropriated by this freely occurring event of inception. (p. 187)

A "solitary thinking," Vallega-Neu calls it (p. 187). Rather than to people, events, or situations, Heidegger's thought is responsive to "a fundamental attunement" in an "abyssal sense of beyng" (p. 188). But Vallega-Neu believes, contrary to Heidegger, that his attunements and thinking, far from being beyond situational experiences, are

rooted in history in a more profane sense than he would like -- not only in the sense that he is part of a philosophical lineage that sees the cradle of civilization in the Greeks, not only in the special task he saw for the Germans and for his own thinking, but also in his resistance against his own times that he voiced even more forcefully in the Black Notebooks. (p. 190)

She speaks of his sense of "deep piety in the attuning words he privileges that are woven into religious lineages he does not seem to acknowledge or be aware of" (p. 190). He was blinded "to his own, let me say, ontic dispositions, a blindness that emerges more evidently in the Black Notebooks" (p. 190). The silent voice of beyng appears to be a symptom of deafness that compliments his ontic blindness. "As I see it," Vallega-Neu says, "his thinking did not allow for an engagement with things and events in their singular happenings" (p. 193). This denial develops throughout the poietic writings. It is a life-denying element embedded in Heidegger's search for a saving knowledge, a mastering knowledge that denies itself as it imposes itself, one that intends a way of being that does not kill bodies, spirits, and thinking by obsessive objectification and preoccupation with beings and everyday life. It is also a search with its deaf attunements, blind presuppositions, and social impotence that enlivens the scars in Vallega-Neu's conscious life. She does not expect those wounding memories to disappear. I believe her acceptance of them with neither compassion nor hatred and without glossing or hiding them has given her an ability to understand the compromises, fears, and weaknesses that marked the lives of people during the Third Reich's reign. They -- her accepted psychological scars, her appropriated unease -- are enfleshed memories that play an important and constructive role in her remarkably successful effort to engage Heidegger's thinking in its singularity, in its strengths and power, as well as in its profound errancy, without losing his particularity in either the mists of imagined inceptions or the satisfactions of revenge and a sense of moral superiority.