Heidegger's Politics of Enframing: Technology and Responsibility

Placeholder book cover

Javier Cardoza-Kon, Heidegger's Politics of Enframing: Technology and Responsibility, Bloomsbury, 2018, 144pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350052598.

Reviewed by Lucas Fain, Suffolk University, Boston


It is puzzling at best that a book which proposes to examine the unspoken political end of Heidegger's doctrine of "enframing" (Gestell) does not address itself to Heidegger's explicit statements about "politics" and "the political" (p. 2). This is all the more puzzling, not only because Heidegger makes this distinction in the readily available winter seminar of 1933-34, but also because Cardoza-Kon presents, as his own innovation, a similar distinction between "two kinds of politics in Heidegger's middle and late thought" (p. 2). The reader is thus presented with (1) "a first order politics of ontology the [sic] deals with the encountering and articulating of what beings are and what Being itself is" and (2) "a second kind (second order politics) that we recognize as common politics in terms of policy and politicians" (p. 2). Textual glitches to one side, this book presumes to show how teasing apart Heidegger's "confused and unarticulated" distinction between "first and second order politics" can illuminate not only the manner of Heidegger's engagement with the movement of National Socialism, but also the sense in which Heidegger understood himself to have taken responsibility for his political involvements through his confrontations with Nietzsche and the enframing power of modern technology (pp. 2, 10-11, 85, 89, 90).

This is a tall task, which is made even taller by the dearth of attention to the relevant primary and secondary sources. Entirely missing are references to some of Heidegger's most important political texts from the 1930s: the summer and winter lecture courses of 1933-34 (excepting a footnote on the translation of polemos, pp. 40-41); the aforementioned winter seminar of 1933-34; and the summer lecture course of 1934. The present volume contains two mentions of the "Black Notebooks," but no citations or quoted material (pp. 1, 3). References to primary source material from the 1930s is largely restricted to the Rectoral Address (1933), the Introduction to Metaphysics (1935), and the Nietzsche lectures (1936-46). There is one reference to the Beiträge (1936-38) on "machination" (p. 93). An introductory footnote lists several landmark works of scholarship on Heidegger's Nazism, but engagement with these volumes is fairly cursory (pp. 1-2). The most sustained discussion of the critical literature appears in summary remarks on the argument of Jürgen Habermas in The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity (1985) -- namely, that Heidegger avoided responsibility for his political commitments by hiding behind his ontological abstractions (pp. 90-93). Otherwise, the reader is told, for example, that "the most controversial and, arguably, one-sided reading of Heidegger" is Victor Farías's Heidegger and Nazism (1987), and "a close second" is Emmanuel Faye's Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy (2005) (p. 1). There are no further explanations.

A blurb on the back cover indicates that this book "will be helpful to readers who are approaching Heidegger's overtly political writings for the first time." It is hard to make the case for this statement when the text under review ignores or avoids some of Heidegger's most salient political remarks.

To provide some context, in the student protocols that record the winter seminar of 1933-34, Heidegger takes up Carl Schmitt's concept of "the political" in order to elaborate the ontological difference between the people and the state. Whereas Schmitt defines "the political" in terms of the friend-enemy distinction and its basis in the real possibility of war and physical violence, Heidegger argues that beneath this ontic conception there is a more fundamental sense, which describes "a way of Being of human beings and what makes the state possible."[1] In contrast to Schmitt, this means that for Heidegger "the political unit does not have to be identical with state and people."[2] Instead, the Being of a people is separable from their Being in a state; and Being in a state is a specific mode of Being a people. With respect to the ontological difference, Heidegger understands "the political" as the ontological mode of Being that accounts for how a people constitutes itself as a people, whereas "politics" concerns the ontic domain of conflicts among peoples and states. It follows from the argument of Being and Time that a people can constitute itself authentically or inauthentically in their way of Being together, in their comportment toward the question of Being.

In commenting on the student protocols from 1933-34, Theodore Kisiel has further identified three distinct concepts of "the political" in Heidegger's analytic of Dasein: the rhetorical-phenomenological, the metaphysical-metontological, and the archaic-poietic.[3] Whereas the rhetorical-phenomenological refers to the domain of persuasion and action, the metaphysical-metontological describes the ontological difference between people and state, while the archaic-poietic regards Heidegger's effort to direct the historical destiny of the German people through a poietic recovery of the essence of German Dasein. The absence of any reference to the winter seminar of 1933-34 and the relevant commentaries thus poses a serious difficulty for any claim concerning Heidegger's allegedly "confused and unarticulated" distinction between "first" and "second" orders of politics.

For Cardoza-Kon, the difference between "first and second order politics" is drawn from the ontological difference between Being and beings. "First order politics" is called "contextual politics," as it concerns "the overall understanding of Being as the horizon within which beings show themselves and are contextualized in the natural world" (p. 5). "Second order politics" is called "contextualized politics," as it is "informed by or 'grounded in' the former" (p. 5). It is a guiding theme of this book that a certain "confusion of the ontic and ontological . . . prevents Heidegger from seeing that Nazism does not (or at least probably should not) share anything whatsoever in common with his philosophy" (p. 89). In connection to the last part of this sentence, it is surprising to find the author's surprise that Heidegger did not share the values of political liberalism (pp. 20, 30).

With respect to the allegation that Heidegger's middle and late thought suffers from some confusion about the political import of the ontological difference, it is more likely that the author is himself confused about the difference between the ontic and the ontological. In the case of Heidegger, it is impossible to address this topic without reference to the mid-1930s Kehre or "turn" in his thought. Cardoza-Kon thematizes Heidegger's "turn" as a progressive transition from the project of fundamental ontology in Being and Time to the history of metaphysics that culminates in Heidegger's confrontation with the enframing power of modern technology (pp. 1-3, 5). These transitions serve as signposts throughout the text, but there is a notable lack of attention to how the Kehre bears on Heidegger's treatment of the ontological difference. Instead, the author states that the "ontological difference is a key component in Heidegger's work from the earliest period to the end of his productive career" (p. 5). In light of this comment, it requires noting that in the Beiträge (1936-38) Heidegger considers how transcendental formulations of the ontological difference are destined to think the difference between beings and Being in terms of the specific differences among particular beings.[4] The problematic treatment of Being as a particular being inspired Heidegger to radicalize the investigation of ontological difference into the thinking of difference as the non-metaphysical ground of historical Being. The author's effort to lay the distinction between "first and second order politics" on top of the historical narrative of the Kehre therefore appears to cause some distortion, as it renders the non-metaphysical ground of historical Being into the historical space of political differencing (pp. 10, 25, 45, 53). As a consequence, it is ambiguous whether the ontological is intrinsically political, or whether the political impinges retroactively upon the ontological.

In Cardoza-Kon's account of the ontological difference between "first" and "second" orders of politics, "first order politics" describes the "horizon of intelligibility" or "context" that "not only allows for an understanding of what entities are, but how they are to be relegated and used." He then adds: "When this sort of understanding is turned on the human it becomes political in that the horizon of intelligibility determines concrete policy and action" (pp. 6-7). On the one hand, these statements seem to indicate that the revealing process of Being is always already political; on the other hand, it's not clear whether the turn of understanding that "becomes political" -- presumably, the comportment toward Being that makes human beings show up as objects to be "relegated" or "used" -- is supposed to be intrinsic to the revealing process of Being itself. The author maintains a "general stance that to be political is to be human Dasein, just as to be human Dasein is to be political" (pp. 59; 15, 27, 56). This tautology roughly speaks to the quality of argumentation that I have found in this book. At best, there are category distinctions that require refinement. At worst, the appropriation of ontological difference as a heuristic for examining Heidegger's alleged confusion about the ontological difference must be subject to the same critique that Heidegger levels against his own thought. Nevertheless, it is the author's prerogative to argue that Heidegger maintains a "confusing and unclear conception of politics," which fails to distinguish "how we relate to things and others" from "how we 'govern' based on these underlying ontological comportments" (pp. 10-11).

The source of this contention appears in Cardoza-Kon's claim that Mitsein or "Being-with" "makes Dasein fundamentally political -- both ontologically and ontically (in a first and second order fashion)" (p. 19). This claim appears to be an assertion. At the very least, there appears to be some conflation between the social and the political, as the author treats "Being-with-one-another" as a synonym for "being political [sic]" (p. 19). This pattern is later repeated when the author takes Heidegger's ontological interpretation of polemos to mean that Dasein is "always" political (pp. 50-56, esp. 56). While there is good reason to investigate the political end of Heidegger's interpretation of polemos in the 1930s, a serious inquiry into the political dimensions of the analytic of Dasein would have to consider Heidegger's reading of Aristotle in the 1920s.[5]

It is, in any event, the author's intention to demonstrate how Heidegger took responsibility for his political involvements through his confrontations with Nietzsche and the enframing power of modern technology. Cardoza-Kon points to Heidegger's posthumously published statement in Der Spiegel that his 1936-46 lectures on Nietzsche constituted a confrontation with National Socialism (pp. 14, 63-66, 83-84). In short, the interrogation of Nietzsche as the "last metaphysician" allowed Heidegger to link National Socialist appropriations of Nietzsche with the enframing power of modern technology, which treats beings -- hence, human beings -- as mere "standing reserve." Heidegger's confrontation with the enframing power of modern technology and his subsequent appeals to Gelassenheit or "releasement" are thus the manner in which he took responsibility for his political engagements. This is at least the picture that Heidegger paints of himself, but the linework is manifestly controversial. A glance at the scholarship of Faye and his critics would be revealing. Nevertheless, the author holds Heidegger's notion of Gelassenheit as a "neo-ethical concept," which involves "letting go of the comportment toward the technological as a game of mastery" (p. 113). The author does not explain how the prefix "neo-" modifies the word "ethical," nor is there a discernable effort to sustain a theory of ethical or political responsibility through an exegetical reading of Heidegger's texts. For that matter, there is a notable lack of consideration for the wide body of literature on Heideggerian notions of "originary ethics."

In the concluding chapter, the author considers how "in articulating the final and nihilistic epoch of Western metaphysics as technology, Heidegger is calling for a preparation of the advent or 'inception' of post-Western (or at least non-Western) thought and, therefore, politics" (p. 127). With inspiration taken from Gianni Vattimo's Nihilism and Emancipation (2003), the author considers how Heidegger's confrontation with the politics of enframing "is something that moves in the direction of pluralism," whereby the invocation of Gelassenheit points to a "post-Western" political pluralism of "letting beings be" (pp. 125, 127-32). In the Afterword that follows, the author assembles some notes for a future thinking of Gelassenheit in relation to work by the Native American educator Gregory Cajete. This seems, in outline, like a promising way to consider how culturally-specific modes of revealing the world can inform cross-cultural understandings of ethical or political responsibility. Whether Heidegger offers a sound way to address issues of ethics or politics is yet another question.

As a final thought, I confess that this book was not pleasant to read. I have tried to restrict these remarks to issues of substance, rather than picking on style or the prevalence of typographical errors and various other anomalies.

[1] Martin Heidegger, "On the Essence and Concept of Nature, History, and State: Seminar, Winter Semester 1933-4," in Nature, History, State: 1933-1934, translated and edited by Gregory Fried and Richard Polt (Bloomsbury, 2013), p. 46.

[2] Ibid.

[3] Theodore Kisiel, "The Seminar of Winter Semester 1933-4 within Heidegger's Three Concepts of the Political," in Ibid., pp. 127-49.

[4] Martin Heidegger, Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event), translated by Richard Rojcewicz and Daniela Vallega-Neu (Indiana University Press, 2012); Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis), in Gesamtausgabe 65, edited by Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (Vittorio Klostermann, 1989), §§132, 258.

[5] For a more nuanced treatment of the politics of polemos, see Gregory Fried's Heidegger's Polemos: From Being to Politics (Yale University Press, 2000). I have also addressed this topic in "Philosophy and the Problem of Beauty in Heidegger's Translation of 'Justice,'" Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal 39.1 (2018), pp. 39-75. NB. The author cites Fried, but not in a way that would support the claim that Dasein is always already "political." It is one thing to say that Dasein is always already engaged in a polemos with Being; it is wholly different to claim that Dasein is always already "political" or that Heidegger's political thought is continuous with his ontology.