Heidelberg Writings: Journal Publications

Placeholder book cover

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Heidelberg Writings: Journal Publications, Brady Bowman and Allen Speight (eds., trs.), Cambridge UP, 2009, xxix + 168pp., $90.00, (hbk), ISBN 9780521833004.

Reviewed by Martin Donougho, University of South Carolina-Columbia



This text — first in a projected series, under the general editorship of Michael Baur — presents two essays from Hegel’s stint at Heidelberg in 1816-18. One essay, previously untranslated, reassesses the philosophical significance of F.H. Jacobi, who had been roundly criticized by the young Hegel in Faith and Knowledge (1802). The other, partially translated by T.M. Knox in Hegel’s Political Writings (Oxford, 1964), is an extended polemic against the Proceedings of the Assembly of the Württemberg Estates, 1815-16. The series aims to offer “translations of the best modern German editions of Hegel’s work in a uniform format suitable for Hegel scholars, together with philosophical introductions and full editorial apparatus” (p. i). This inaugural volume gets things off to an excellent start.

On taking up his position at Heidelberg Hegel was invited to help edit the Jahrbücher der Literatur (Yearbooks of Literature). He clearly relished the chance to engage in a public forum beyond teaching and esoteric theorizing. Written in a relatively accessible style, the pieces here display a different, more expansive side to Hegel’s personality. As interventions in cultural and political life they may be seen as a rehearsal for his career at the University of Berlin. They appear, moreover, at a time critical for reconsidering the political and cultural legacy — post-Kantian, post-revolutionary, post-Napoleonic — of the period of Hegel’s youthful formation.

Hegel’s high estimate of Jacobi may be gauged by the fact (however veiled) that his novel Woldemar figures centrally in the dialectic of the “beautiful soul” towards the end of the Phenomenology. For some years Hegel was anxious to mend fences with the older man, who had been considerably angered by the earlier attack on his ideas. In any event, the overtures seemed to mollify Jacobi, who nevertheless confessed himself puzzled by Hegel’s continued criticisms (and perhaps too old to try to grasp their rationale). What the review essay offers is little short of a potted account of Jacobi’s place in the development of philosophy over the previous thirty years; an account which, as Terry Pinkard’s biography remarks, takes Jacobi less as Hegel’s opponent than as his own precursor. Volume 3 of Jacobi’s Works included the well-known ‘Letter to Fichte’ (1799), the critique of Kant’s attempt ‘to bring reason to understanding,’ i.e., its senses (1801), and a final dispute with Schelling, ‘On divine things’ (1811). Yet Hegel opts to preface his remarks with an overview of Jacobi’s entire project, starting from the infamous Letters on the Doctrine of Spinoza (1785, enlarged 1789) which had given rise to the so-called “Pantheism Dispute.” Jacobi discerned a current in Enlightenment thinking deeper than the Lockeian empiricism which in French hands posits an abstract ‘nature’; a current some nowadays dub “the radical Enlightenment” (Jonathan Israel, Margaret Jacob), and under Spinozist aegis. Jacobi praised Spinoza for seeking to reconcile appearance and reason, but warned of the mortal danger of reducing the rational world to materialist explanation; in his view, such determinism becomes the fate of all systematic philosophy. Hegel in turn praises Jacobi’s insight into the need to recast substance (or God) as spirit, as living and free personality, while faulting his inability to see that an immediate belief in God is in fact always mediated via a dialectic of negativity or reflection. Jacobi fails to acknowledge the reflection at work in his own thinking.1

A similar charge is leveled at Jacobi’s tussle with Kant. On the one hand he recognizes the arbitrariness of the Kantian categories of understanding and hence a need for their justification by reason; on the other he underestimates the extent to which Kant’s system is animated by a certain freedom of spirit — by autonomy, in short, theoretical or practical self-determination. Criticizing Fichte, Jacobi is taken as right to fasten on the “dreary” abstraction of duty as opposed to the concrete existence of the “heart.” But a merely subjective heart lacks the kind of rational context available to Aristotle (as polis or character and disposition). Hegel has little to say about the final dispute with Schelling, save to remark on the “form” in which Jacobi advances his position, always with ‘ésprit’ (das Geistreiche — which the translators deem well-nigh untranslatable). Jacobi’s utterance goes beyond the literal-minded terms of understanding, often resorting to the tacit mode of personal address. In sum, Hegel’s own ‘geistreich’ appreciation of Jacobi comes through in what is (for Hegel) a relatively transparent and economical treatment. We should be grateful for its availability in translation.

The review of the Estates Proceedings is quite different: somewhat repetitive and apt to digress, often polemical, but all told an attempt directly to intervene in current events (it did gain a certain notoriety, the editors remark in their fine introduction, especially when reissued by a government exploiting the piece to support its own case). Given that the text has already been partially translated, we might wonder whether it deserves redoing (Knox’s effort reads smoothly enough with adequate annotation, and while he regrets being able to translate less than half the original he adds, fairly enough, that some of the omitted material is of antiquarian interest). On balance I should say that Hegel scholarship merits having the entire text, now keyed to Volume 15 of the Gesammelte Werke (1990) and taking account of recent secondary literature. Moreover it bears importantly, if ambiguously, on Hegel’s later political theory: not just the 1821 Philosophy of Right but equally the various lecture-series at Heidelberg and Berlin.

What prompted this extensive effort of over a hundred pages? That remains a good question. We should note, first, that Hegel was from Württemberg, and as Dickey and Toews argued in their fine studies of the intellectual background, he was formed by its unique combination of theological and political culture.2 The old constitution divided power between Duke and Estates, while it was largely administered by an elite of a few score intermarried families. Hegel’s own parents did not belong to the Ehrbarkeit, although his father worked in related circles, and he himself attended the famous Tübingen Stift. Like many of his contemporaries he had had to leave this strange time capsule, yet here was a chance to revisit his past, now peculiarly relevant to post-Napoleonic circumstances. The Vienna Treaty of 1815 ratified a new balance of power in Europe, one consequence of which (by article 13 of the Bundesakte) was that each German territory was empowered to seek its own constitution. The Württemberg government, now headed by a king (Friedrich I), realized that it had to reconcile its own ambitions with those of the ‘Altrechtler’ or believers in the “good old law,” as well as cope with the expansion of its territories beyond those of the old order.3 The king proposed a new constitution, presented to the Estates Assembly in late 1815. He found himself opposed not merely by those (including the church) who wished to retain their old privileges, but also by the “mediated” nobles who had hitherto seen themselves as bound only to the emperor (they had now to pay taxes, etc.), and by liberals suspicious of royal authority. The Proceedings on which Hegel comments are the record of their long-winded deliberations over the amendments put forward by Friedrich’s more liberal son Wilhelm I as well.

Hegel’s own position is difficult to sort out. As Pinkard observes, it goes beyond a merely ‘psychological’ approach to motives and personalities so as to consider general principles at work in the actions taken, and it tries to set them in historical perspective, one that above all pertains to the break between modern rationality and the tattered afterlife of a feudal past. The battle was not simply between reformers and reactionaries, or between royalists and democrats: the monarchy might function either to help or to hinder a constitutional make-over. The decisive question for Hegel was how to achieve a modern constitutional state, once the French Revolution and Napoleon had between them swept away the old cobwebs (Hegel paints a colorful picture of history as an old house subjected to a series of add-ons by various owners, the result being an untidy pile — not that it justifies a wholesale tear-down). Hegel’s own model, to be more fully developed in the Philosophy of Right, is of a rational articulation of functions in which constitutional monarchy is enmeshed with popular representation (though not through “atomistic” plebiscite). “A living connection lies only in an articulated whole, whose parts form the particular, subsidiary circles” (p. 48), as he puts it. The monarch is less a person than a persona, whose function (as Hegel later puts it) is just to dot the i’s and cross the t’s. By praising the king’s role Hegel is aware that he risks being viewed as servile, courtly, partial, and conniving (p. 37) — precisely what his critics would then accuse him of, here and later in Berlin. But Losurdo is correct, I think: there is an underlying consistency to Hegel’s views, as he tactically balances top-down and bottom-up approaches to sovereignty, wary both of royal “personality” and of democratic individualism.4 He was neither royalist, feudally subject, nor conservative, taking what he calls “the sense for the state” as a being embedded in some monolithic entity prior to articulation into civil society and state proper. Not least, for Hegel an administrative bureaucracy came to matter as much as legal constitution in guaranteeing freedom.

As the editors admit, Hegel’s unrelenting attack on the Estates Assembly is, and was seen as, distinctly one-sided. Moreover, it did encourage Hegel’s being typed as royalist and legitimist. The polemical tone surprises in other ways as well. Hegel’s contempt for the “notary system” (Schreibers-Unfug) is furious,5 as he cites Burke on the imprudence of having lawyers dominate the Assembly, and quotes many instances of financial abuse by these notaries. He accuses the entrenched interests of the Estates of — in words attributed to Talleyrand — being like the aristocratic émigrés from Louis XVI’s court, having “forgotten nothing and learned nothing.”6 He is unremitting in his attack on the German disease of “formalism” - we have buried the old forms of law but they rule us from their graves (to adapt Maitland). By nailing his reformist colors to the mast in this way, however, Hegel did not advance his cause as well as he might have hoped. Yet, by virtue of exposing himself to misunderstanding, he may be viewed as preparing the way to a subtler and more thorough treatment in his later philosophy of right.

About the translation, annotation, introduction, and bibliographic apparatus there can be no complaints (I am unsure about odd words such as ‘gramina’ or ‘disceptation,’ but that’s my own ignorance and they are in Hegel’s German). There is a twenty-page glossary of translated terms, a useful index (no longer something to take for granted), and foot rather than endnotes. Lastly, the typeface, layout, and paper are excellent (again, things not to be taken for granted).

1 Hegel’s final coming-to-terms with Jacobi comes in the revisions to Book 1 of the Science of Logic, 1832.

2 Lawrence Dickey, Hegel: Religion, Economics, and the Politics of Spirit, 1770-1807 (Cambridge UP, 1987); John Edward Toews, Hegelianism: the path toward dialectical humanism, 1805-1841 (Cambridge UP, 1980).

3 James Sheehan, German History: 1770-1866 (Oxford UP, 1989), p. 417.

4 Domenico Losurdo, Hegel and the Freedom of Moderns (Duke UP, 2004), pp. 39f.

5 Knox quaintly translates ‘Schreiber’ as ‘writer,’ as he notes “in the Scottish sense of e.g. ‘Writers of the Signet’” (p. 284): a note that itself should have had a footnote!

6 In Gesammelte Werke 15, the editors comment that Hegel reverses the order of Talleyrand’s reported words, but add that they had already become a familiar saying. Knox — unlike Bowman and Speight — notes the likely source, but links the occasion with Louis XVIII. True, Talleyrand could well have said the same of that stubborn king, or indeed of the ultraroyalists of the Chambre introuvable in 1815. Doubtless Hegel was aware of many such battles between reactionaries and progressives throughout Europe in this time of transition.