Hell and the Mercy of God

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Adrian J. Reimers, Hell and the Mercy of God, Catholic University of America Press, 2017, 256pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780813229409.

Reviewed by Jerry L. Walls, Houston Baptist University


The doctrine of eternal hell has been a matter of considerable interest and controversy in Christian academic circles for the past two or three decades. The doctrine has come under fire from several sides, and a number of Christian thinkers are defending alternative views to the traditional claim that those who do not achieve salvation will experience eternal conscious misery as the just punishment for their sins. One alternative is conditionalism, or annihilationism, which hold that those who reject salvation will be punished ultimately with literal destruction. Having rejected the very source of life, their final fate is death. Another alternative that is being defended by an increasing number of adherents is universalism, the view that all persons will finally be saved. On this view, "hell" is actually purgatory, and all will eventually find their way out of it and enter into life. Defenders of universalism range from those who think it is a possibility to be hoped for, to those who think it is definitely true, or even necessarily true.

While these controversies have occupied theologians and Biblical scholars, particularly in Protestant circles, philosophers have also engaged these debates during this period, and there is now a considerable body of literature by analytic philosophers about the doctrine of hell. Given the range of fascinating and important issues here, it is easy to see why philosophers have weighed in on the discussion. For a start, hell is part of the problem of evil, and is arguably the most difficult part of the problem since it represents an eternal evil that is never redeemed. The question of how a perfectly good and powerful God allows so much evil is exacerbated if that evil includes eternal misery. Closely related is the question of how finite sinners who commit a finite number of sins can ever merit eternal punishment. Then there are a whole fistful of questions related to human freedom. Does it make coherent sense to say that any rational creature might freely choose eternal misery for himself? Is such freedom the sort of "gift" that is really worth having if it can be abused at so high a cost? Could not God eventually find a way to win all persons to himself? And so on.

Given the important issues at stake, a book length defense of hell by a philosopher is an interesting project worthy of attention. This recent defense of hell by Adrian Reimers is certainly an interesting one, but prospective readers should know from the outset that it is not what they might have expected. Rather surprisingly, Reimers altogether ignores the discussion of hell by analytic philosophers over the past few decades. In the Preface, he reports that he "does not strive directly to engage the state of scholarly discussion and debate on these issues" (p. xii). And true to this claim, he pretty much ignores analytic philosophy generally, and does not, so far as I recall, interact with, or even cite, a single book or article from the recent analytic discussion of hell. Indeed, he characterizes his book as "very much a personal work," and observes that, given the personal nature of his work, "parts of it may even have a somewhat devotional character." Of course, the fact that he does not aim "directly" to engage the scholarly discussion and debate does not mean he does not intend indirectly to do so.

The personal nature of the work arose from two particular sources. First was his research on happiness, especially on Aquinas's view of God as the ultimate end for human beings and how it relates to Karol Wojtyla's (John Paul II) account of the good for human beings. The book accordingly works from the framework of Thomistic metaphysics and moral philosophy, and expounds the issues in those terms. In addition to numerous citations of Aquinas, it is also peppered with numerous quotes from Pope John Paul II. In this way, as well as others, it is very much a work of traditional Roman Catholic philosophy. The second source is his many conversations with students who have posed the question of how a merciful God can consign sinners to endless torment in hell.

To note the personal character of this book is not to trivialize it, or to suggest it is not a valuable contribution to the literature on hell. To the contrary, by situating the discussion within the larger context of the ultimate good, and seeking to write a book that will address the questions of his students, the author maintains a moral and religious seriousness that is sometimes absent from philosophical discussions of the doctrine of hell. Indeed, this discussion of hell is also framed by the larger theological convictions that give it meaning, so the author devotes chapters to the fall of Satan, original sin and the fall of man, judgment and the mystery of evil, and resurrection and final judgment. Isolated from these larger contexts, the doctrine of hell may make little sense and can hardly be seen as anything more than a relic of our religious and cultural past.

But when we understand hell in light of these claims, the doctrine makes deep sense. Indeed, it is precisely because the true good for human beings is so extraordinary that the notion of hell is conceivable. As Reimers observes, "The primordial root of judgment is God's offer of love, his offer to welcome into his company anyone, whether angel or human being, who would turn to him and look for that love" (p. 60). And later:

The last judgment is not about God's inflicting pain on those who broke his rules or who failed to join the right church or say the right kind of prayers. It is about separating the merciful from those who had chosen against love. God is love and to choose against him is to choose against love (p 154).

Reimers expands on this picture of the nature of damnation by explicating the nature of despair, which he further elaborates with a discussion of the seven deadly sins and how they illuminate the hard reality that a life characterized by rejecting the love of God is bound to end in futility and a profound sort of emptiness. Indeed, the author has a chapter on "Hell on Earth," which he begins with the telling observation that "anyone who believes that hell cannot really exist is simply not paying attention. Hell is presaged, and to a limited extent, present on this earth" (p 55).

Still, as much as hell may be presaged on earth, Reimers thinks the hell to come is incomparably worse. One of the most striking aspects of this book, and one that many contemporary readers may find incredulous is his stark emphasis on the reality of Satan and his role in the misery of the damned. Hell, as he sees it, is the place "where Satan reigns. It is the realm of power, manipulation, and anti-love . . . .it is a state of satanic abuse and enmity" (p 91). Reimers takes quite seriously the claim that Satan not only influences human beings in this life, but also torments them in the life to come. "In hell the pains of the body are never alleviated, and there is no sympathy. In hell there is no encouragement -- only demons to scream that the damned is worthless, a failure, and will be eternally so" (p 201; cf 196-8; 207).

Incidentally, it is somewhat ironic that in one of the few places where Reimers engages contemporary analytic philosophy, he criticizes Alvin Plantinga's free will defense on the grounds that it "fails to address why God permits nonmoral evils, such as tornadoes, house fire, earthquakes, and mad dogs" (p 220). Plantinga in fact suggests that such "nonmoral" evils can actually be accounted for as moral evils wrought by Satan and other fallen angels. Of course, here as in his free will defense generally, he is not providing a theodicy, but merely a defense that is a logically possible explanation of evil. In any case, given Reimer's appeal to the reality to the Satanic realm, it is rather surprising that he would level this criticism against Plantinga's free will defense.­

Even those who take fully seriously the existence of Satan and other fallen angels may think Reimers advances claims that go beyond anything warranted by the clear teaching of Scripture or strong philosophical argument. He does not hesitate to describe and analyze in some detail Satan's psychology, and readers may be dubious that we have enough to go on to make such confident claims. Moreover, he may give too much credit, not to mention ascribe too much success, to the Satanic rebellion in thinking hell is his society. "The hell of hell is that Satan is in charge" (p. 239). If Satan and his minions are in charge of hell, and even take pleasure in tormenting their hapless human victims, then it seems hell is much less hell to them than it is to damned human beings. Alternatively, we should think God is in charge of hell, as he is everything else, and all those who choose to go there experience the misery that is necessarily entailed by rejecting his love and grace, angels and humans alike.

Of course, there are other points at which various critics will disagree with the argument in this book. I will mention just a couple I found objectionable. First, I am dubious of the notion that the choice of evil by immaterial beings is outside of time, and once made is irrevocable (pp. 29, 144-146). Any finite creature, it seems, can consider the choice to disobey and reject God, and even be tempted by it. But such consideration seems to be a temporal experience insofar as it involves considering options, feeling their attraction, and so on. Nor does it seem clear why such a choice must be irrevocable. Finite beings may well experience evil differently than they had expected it to be and reconsider the wisdom of the choice, not unlike the Prodigal son ruminating in the pig pen after his life of pleasure and independence from his father did not turn out as he thought it would.

Second, I found Reimers's discussion of the possibility of salvation for good pagans remarkably restrained, given the theme of divine mercy that runs through the book. "The book's fundamental theme is the dynamic economy of mercy" (p xii). One way he underscores this theme is in this observation: "The Lord's standards are actually very low: what is necessary is to turn to Jesus, believing he has the power to save . . . and ask him. A person is saved simply by asking Jesus for help" (p 4; cf. 7, 31). In view of this, it is somewhat surprising that he is so equivocal about the prospects for the salvation of good pagans (pp 69ff). If such pagans are anything like Dante depicts them, as mourning the loss of heaven as they look upon it from limbo, it seems such persons would readily embrace the offer of salvation and be saved. Reimer does grant that we may hope for the salvation of good pagans, but again, his affirmation of this hope is rather reserved.

All in all, however, readers will find in this volume a robust and provocative account of the nature of evil and the horror of damnation, one that is morally challenging and edifying as well as illuminating.