Henri Bergson

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Vladimir Jankélévitch, Henri Bergson, Nils F. Schott and Alexandre Lefebvre (eds.), Nils F. Schott (tr.), Duke University Press, 2015, 322pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822359357.

Reviewed by Nicolas de Warren, Husserl Archive, KU Leuven


Vladimir Jankélévitch's Henri Bergson was published in 1930 and expanded with three additional chapters in 1959 to take into account Bergson's Two Sources of Morality and Religion (1932). It exemplifies Jankélévitch's statement in homage to his maître à penser in 1959 that there is a "necessity to think Bergson in a Bergsonian way" [254]. As Jankélévitch nimbly develops in his first book (earlier essays on Bergson had appeared in the 1920s; his L'Odyssée de la conscience dans la dernière philosophie de Schelling would follow in 1933), "to think Bergson in a Bergsonian way" is above all to eschew any form of "Bergsonianism" or "Bergsonism," indeed, any form of "ism" -- dualism, spiritualism, etc. -- that would effectively make of Bergson's thinking an artificially constructed doctrine or fixed theory, or, in other words, something of the past. In announcing his book (in the original 1930 introduction) as neither an "apology" or "exposition," Jankélévitch goes against the current of debates surrounding the meaning of "Bergsonianism" during Bergson's silent decade of the 1920s.

Neither "apology" nor "exposition" (the first, too defensively committed; the second, too non-committal), Jankélévitch proposes instead to render Bergson's thinking "understandable," by which he means, contemporary, in the specific sense of engaging Bergson's thinking in its vitality, as a vital philosophy. To approach Bergson's thinking as "living" is to approach Bergson's thinking as a source for one's own thinking; it is to accept Bergson's philosophical thinking as a challenging act of generosity. As Bergson acknowledges in a letter to Jankélévitch (Jankélévitch first befriended Bergson in 1923), thanking him for the "the honor of dedicating a work to the whole of my writings," "this work of analysis goes hand in hand with a singularly interesting effort of synthesis: often my point of arrival was for you a point of departure for original speculations of your own" [249]. Indeed, Jankélévitch's Henri Bergson is richly textured with reflections and digressions which sketch in embryonic form conceptual figures that would gain prominence in his later ethical writings ("organ-obstacle," "je-ne-sais-quoi," "irreversibility"). Jankélévitch's book is thus not so much about Bergson, as it is a book through Bergson, and its two-stroke motion of understanding Bergson and of Jankélévitch understanding himself is animated by a joy that gives Jankélévitch's philosophical prose (finely translated by Nils F. Schott) an almost breathless quality. It is a book that a reader must often run after.

As Alexandre Lefebvre notes in his introduction, Jankélévitch's "interweaving of interpretation and improvisation makes it difficult to keep the principal lines of the book in sight" [xx]. Although the sinuous composition of Jankélévitch's study tacks back and forth between "interpretation" and "improvisation," its structure follows the chronological appearance of Bergson's main writings from Time and Free Will to Two Sources of Morality and Religion. This English translation reproduces the seven chapters of the 1959 edition, and usefully includes as appendices Jankélévitch's essay "Bergson and Judaism," two shorter texts on Bergson from the 1950s, and a clutch of letters between Bergson and Jankélévitch (as well as Jankélévitch's 1923 letter to his friend Louis Beauduc in which he recounts his first meeting with Bergson).

In contrast to Deleuze's Bergsonism and its depiction of the progression of Bergson's thinking through the three essential concepts of duration, memory, and élan vital, Jankélévitch's presentation of Bergson's philosophical development avoids any retrospective projection of a definitive finality onto an emerging evolution from the perspective of its completed achievement, or what Jankélévitch terms (adopting this notion from Bergson's thinking) "the illusion of retrospectivity." As Jankélévitch remarks with regard to The Two Sources of Morality and Religion: "After the fact, it seems to us that Bergson's philosophy could not have concluded otherwise than it did. And yet no one could have predicted what was to arrive" [151]. Thus, although its seven chapters tracks the sequence of Bergson's main works (Time and Free Will, Matter and Memory, Creative Evolution, and Two Sources of Morality and Religion), Jankélévitch's improvisatory interpretation does not map a linear movement and progression of Bergsonian concepts, but delineates, in a more complex motion, the unfolding of Bergsonian problems. The spiraling movement of Jankélévitch's discussion (admittedly, a challenge for a reader unfamiliar with his imitable style of thinking) tacks back and forth through Bergson's main writings as different orders, or planes, of thinking in dialectical relation with each other. Jankélévitch's innovative method consists here in applying to Bergson's thinking the method of Bergson's own thinking, namely, that "Bergson's philosophy is one of the rare philosophies in which the investigation's theory blends with the investigation itself" [3]. Jankélévitch stresses that the "method" of Bergson's thinking -- intuition -- is immanent to its principal object -- duration. Likewise, Jankélévitch's study operates immanently within Bergson's thinking; it approaches Bergson's thinking as a creative evolution, moving through "orders of multiplicities" (i.e., different writings organized along different conceptual oppositions) and configurations of duration (i.e., forms of conceptual becoming). Bergson's thinking is fundamentally a philosophy of duration that takes the form of duration itself in its creative expression, and this expression of creativity is expressed once again, doubled, as it were, in Jankélévitch's blending of interpretation and improvisation.

This sophisticated approach, where the writing is not distinct from the mediation of its object, allows Jankélévitch to witness from within the generation of Bergson's thinking ("interpretation") while at the same time providing a living testimony from without ("improvisation") to its significance. Rather than consider Bergson's thinking as a "theory of knowledge," "a critique of knowledge" or a "philosophy of intuition," Jankélévitch understands Bergson's thinking as a "concrete philosophy" of duration, whose evolution is animated by the "successive incarnations of four problem types" [4]. These four types of problem (intellectual effort, freedom, finality, heroism) are structured around a tension, or opposition, between conceptual planes (space and duration, matter and memory, closed and open, etc.). As Jankélévitch stresses, Bergson's aim is never to build a system or establish a theory in which problems are dialectically solved and hence, put to rest. The élan of Bergson's thinking moves along "lines of facts" (les lignes de faits), or planes of thinking, in search of a unity that is neither intended or envisioned beforehand, but discovered, after the fact, in a manner that launches once again, but along a different path of flight, the renewed and re-oriented pursuit of philosophical problems.

In a manner that anticipates Deleuze (or directly influenced -- this book must surely have been known to Deleuze), but with a much a stronger emphasis on the negative dialectical character of Bergsonian problems, Jankélévitch understands Bergson's critical method of intuition as a method for the dissolution of false problems. The critical discernment of intuition undoes the confusion between different planes of meaning, re-establishes the proper configuration of parts and wholes, and guards against the illusion of retrospective finality. Bergsonian problems are not, however, dialectically resolved. In a manner more akin to Jean Wahl's negative dialectical concept, a problem becomes dissolved when what was first understood as a contradiction or opposition becomes re-configured into productive circuit, or becoming of a new concept. Each of Bergson's main works is, from this perspective, organized around the dissolution of false problems (indeterminism vs. determinism, mechanism vs. spiritualism, mind vs. body, etc.) so as to forge genuine problems which in turn delineate the direction of thinking for a subsequent work. In this manner, the tensions that run through the apparent dualisms in Bergson's thinking (matter and memory, closed morality and open morality, etc.) are neither reduced to a single-minded monism nor frittered away into a "dilettantism" of the concept.

Jankélévitch begins in Chapter One, "Organic Totalities," with a general set of considerations on Bergson's thinking as a philosophy of duration. The centrality of intuition, which attracted the attention of Bergson's first commentators and first marked "Bergsonianism" as a philosophy of intuition, is re-centered by Jankélévitch on the "primitive fact" of duration. This primitive fact of duration is manifest as the experience of the "infinitely simple." The notion of "the simple" -- not to be confused with "simplicity" or "simplification" -- becomes crucial in Jankélévitch's reading of Bergson as it holds the key for a proper understanding of how Bergson's conception of duration re-configures the classical philosophical problems of the one and the many, parts and whole, and being and becoming. As the proper method for the conceptualization of duration, intuition provides an alternative to intellectualism and its proclivity to hypostasize parts for wholes or conjure wholes into a seamless continuity of parts. This confusion of the living relation between parts and wholes, as a multiplicity of duration, or "becoming," underpins both the images of Bergson's thinking as a "Bergsonianism" and the intellectualist production of false philosophical problems. As the idol of intellectualism par excellence, Jankélévitch critically identifies what he terms the retrospective illusion of the future perfect or, in other words, the retrospective projection of teleological finality [18].

In Chapter Two, "Freedom," Jankélévitch turns to Bergson's first work, Time and Free Will (Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience). As Jankélévitch argues, "the primary objective of Time and Free Will . . . is to dissociate mixed concepts, to separate the confused levels whose collaborations Bergson will later focus on" [40]. In contrast to the continuous multiplicity of space, duration is a discontinuous multiplicity of becoming in which any strict separation between "being" and "becoming" becomes not so much blurred or sublimated, as volatized, set into motion. Through this discovery of duration, Bergson's main achievement in Time and Free Will consists in the resolution of the classic metaphysical anti-thesis between being and becoming such that Bergson discovers human existence as intrinsically temporal, as duration. As Jankélévitch comments: "the human being is not only 'temporal' in the sense that temporality would be a qualifying adjective of its substance: it is the human being who is time itself (and nothing but time), who is the ipseity of time" [49]. With this insight, the problem of freedom becomes displaced from its traditional frame opposition between voluntarism and involuntarism. Freedom enters into the very substance of human existence; the temporality of human existence is freedom. On this conception, a free action is understood as a true beginning and "radical creation" which, on the one hand, emerges from the "total past" while, on the other hand, brings forth, in a moment of surprise, something new. Each act of freedom stands as a testimony to the person in her entirety; "what is free, is what is total and profound" [65]. Likewise, the entire self remains contemporaneous in its acting; nothing of who I am escapes from the responsibility of acting. As Jankélévitch remarks in a manner that anticipates the existential ontology of Sartrean freedom: "Freedom expires in the choice that nonetheless manifests itself" [145].

In Chapter Three, "Soul and Body," Jankélévitch argues that the anti-theses first explored in Time and Free Will (space and duration, being and becoming, parts and whole) become re-configured into another series of anti-theses (matter and memory, mind and body, pure perception and pure recollection). Bergson's thinking in Matter and Memory thus continues in the flight of thought developed in Time and Free Will, and yet cannot be seen as continuous with the problem types addressed in Time and Free Will. In Matter and Memory, Bergson directs his thinking against mind-body dualism in its various forms as well as any reductionism of the spiritual to the material or, likewise, the absorption of the material into the spiritual. Jankélévitch here considers the polarity of pure perception and pure recollection as the organizing tension in Bergson's work. Whereas pure perception places the mind in the presence of things (we perceive the object from where it is), pure recollection represents an entirely disinterested form of remembrance, entirely removed from the field of action that determines perception in its mixed and concrete condition, as a perception always shaped by memory and directed by the requirements of acting in the world. If pure perception establishes Bergson's principle of realism, pure recollection reflects his pure idealism. Pure perception and pure recollection are in fact limits within a spectrum of different planes of experience which are superimposed on each other. As Jankélévitch thus suggests, Bergson's "true idealism is conjoined with a scrupulous realism" [81].

This superimposition of "different levels of reality" (pure perception as images outside of us; pure recollection as images inside us) is crisply manifest in the phenomenon of error. If pure perception places the mind in the midst of the world, how is error possible? In an extremely supple discussion, Jankélévitch addresses Bergson's consideration of the multiple sources of error (and not just the classical obsession with the issue of perceptual hallucination). The source of error is not perception, but memory. The present is encountered from the past; it is in terms of the past that we perceive the world such that pure perception is always "mixed" or "contaminated" by the history of how we have already perceived, and hence, thought the world, as a function of how we have already acted in the world. On this account, memory is neither a static repository of traces or a storehouse of images; it is an active force that both contracts the present into the past and extends the past into the present. As Jankélévitch writes:

We do not reconstruct the past on the basis of the present, we place ourselves straightaway in the past -- this virtual past that is us and that projects us into action, far from letting itself be a justified a posteriori. Memory is inspiration, impulsion; it is not retrospective and regressive induction. [93]

This discussion of error introduces Bergson's central insight into the relations between matter and memory, perception and recollection, past and present, as a "circuit of centrifugal and centripetal currents." This circuit is exemplified with memory, for as Jankélévitch observes, "memory can be considered either in the present participle or in the past participle: either as 'giving' or as 'given'" [103]. As a "current," memory is both the continuation of the past in the present and the survival of the present in the past. Most importantly, on account of this inevitable admixture of matter and memory, perception and recollection, the mind is always ahead or behind itself: we are always too late or too early for the real. As Jankélévitch writes:

Prejudiced memory is always ahead or behind, and that is why it scrambles the levels of consciousness. Either it is ahead and thus, obeying its natural inclination, imposes on nature the sordid uniformity of its prejudices without taking the time to observe the capricious diversity of things. Or it is behind, discouraged by the sight of all this originality springing us, it prefers remaining the prisoner of its dream. Powerlessness or impatience -- prejudiced memory never marks the same time as real things do. [106]

The mind is, however, animated by an élan towards the real; the mind becomes generous in moving beyond itself towards a present that is always other than how the world has already been encountered. A generous mind does not remain with itself. It does not remain smug with its own past. Instead, as Jankélévitch notes, "going beyond itself, it [generous mind] seeks to encounter something other than its own image because it needs nourishing and truly positive realities" [107].

Chapter Four, "Life," turns to Bergson's Creative Evolution, where, as with Bergson's other works, Jankélévitch considers Bergson's thinking as organized around the resolution of conceptual oppositions: instinct and intelligence, mechanism and finality, matter and life. For Jankélévitch, Creative Evolution "rises above the traditional conflict between mechanism and finality." Both positions tacitly adopt the illusion of an accomplished act, either in the form of a discrete act (or stage of evolution) shorn from duration (mechanism) or in the form of the illusion of retrospective finality (biological determinism). Mechanism and biological finality are each beholden to an image of linear evolution. For Bergson, however, evolution is "pluri-dimensional" and "radiation," yet this creative multiplication of life-forms does not amount to a dilation in all directions, or, in other words, an evolutionary form of dilettantism. Evolution unfolds along a self-generated direction, but this directedness of evolution is not determined beforehand by a fixed ideal or telos. Evolution appears at each stage to be oriented towards a goal, yet the intellect is never able to anticipate the veritable goal of evolution and advent of novel forms of life. The élan vital running through evolution, in its creative advent of different forms of life, is not a metaphysical will or spiritual conatus. Against any reading that would inscribe Bergson within a tradition of Romantic Naturphilosophie or 19th-century French vitalism, the principle of élan vital is "nothing" since it designates for Jankélévitch "a certain direction [allure] of evolution": "in this way, the vital thrust is determined just enough not to progress randomly, without cause and direction."

With these improvising interpretations of Bergson's notions of creative evolution and élan vital, Jankélévitch begins to fashion a conception of tragedy which comes to gain increased prominence in his subsequent chapters on The Two Sources of Morality and Religion. In discussing how intelligence falls prey to the fabrication of its own idols (i.e., biological determinism and mechanism), Jankélévitch observes: "Knowledge is only possible because I can be posterior to the fact. The tragedy of the mind consists in this, that our knowledge of objects so to speak obstructs our intimate and central understanding of them" [117]. This vision of the tragic is connected to one of Bergson's most profound conceptual discoveries: "the organ-obstacle." As Jankélévitch writes:

there is no idea more profound and fertile in Bergson's philosophy. Bodies . . . far from being the cause or even the simple translation of the spiritual, on the contrary represents everything the soul has had to vanquish to live alongside a matter that seems to do violence to it and in which it believes itself to be boxed in. The soul cannot be without a body and yet it is not made for the body either. [139]

Readers of Jankélévitch's later writings (especially, Forgiveness and La mort ou l'expérience de l'impensable) will immediately recognize the negative dialectic of the organ-obstacle as one of the more profound and fertile ideas in Jankélévitch's own philosophy. In its most generalized form, the conceptual figure of the organ-obstacle crystallizes an essential dimension of Bergson's metaphysical thought. As Jankélévitch remarks: "The truth is that in Bergson's philosophy there are not as much as two opposed 'principles' as two inverse movements: one ascending, the other descending" [143]. Whether in the form of matter and memory, pure perception and pure recollection, space and duration, etc., this circuit of two inverse movements configures the different levels, or lines of fact, in Bergson's evolving thinking. For Jankélévitch, this circuit is essentially tragic. As he writes in the context of Creative Evolution: "What is most tragic is that the deadly tendency lives at the heart of vitality itself. In order to affirm itself, life, in a singular derision, needs the matter that kills it. In life, there is a rift that emerges and is resolved in the continued movement of becoming" [145]. And yet, as Jankélévitch equally insists, this dialectic tension of the organ-obstacle, for example, the body as both the organ and the obstacle of the mind, does not produce unresolvable contradictions but produces instead, as with the example of the human lived body, stable structures. In a striking statement, Jankélévitch proposes an interpretation of Creative Evolution as the unfolding of a tragic vision. As he writes:

Evolution sums up this tragedy. Life must come out of the possible to be complete, for there is nothing like the real . . . memory only liberates us by perpetually lagging behind life . . . the function of the mind is not to elude contradiction but, on the contrary, to accept it wholeheartedly to resolve itself. [189]

Added to the 1959 edition, Chapters 5, 6, and 7 ("Heroism and Saintliness," "The Nothingness of Concepts and the Plenitude of Spirit," "Simplicity . . . and Joy") address The Two Sources of Morality and Religion and the essays published in 1938 in Creative Mind (La pensée et le mouvant). Bergson's silence during 1920s heightened the anticipation of the possible implications of his philosophical thought (Creative Evolution appeared in 1907) for questions of religion and ethics, especially, the vexing issue of God. With the publication of The Two Sources of Morality and Religion, however, as Jankélévitch argues, "something has changed".The vision of morality and religion here developed "eludes all predications and anticipations" with its emphasis on the opposition between "closed" morality and "open" morality, and on "superior individuals" (surhommes) -- heroes and saints -- for the advent of a genuine and unbounded fraternity of mankind. As with his previous works, The Two Sources of Morality and Religion is constructed around an array of conceptual oppositions: the closed morality of duty, utilitarianism, and violence as opposed to the open morality of charity, infinite love, and devotion; instinct as opposed to intelligence; closed religion (paganism, impure Monotheism) as opposed the opening of the genuinely religious in the crucible of mystical experience. The passage from closed morality/religion to open morality/religion turns on a fundamental rupture. As Jankélévitch comments:

There certainly is love in closed communities, nation or family: nonetheless, loving against someone, loving by excluding enemies, is not yet loving with that infinite love that is charity. The veritable break is thus not between family and city, which are, all in all, two groupings of the same type, but between the city and humankind. [154]

This transformation depends on the force of "superior individuals" (surhommes) -- heroes and saints (notably missing is the figure of the philosopher) -- who would initiate an ontological break with the circularity of closed morality. This rupturing break-through of the infinite, or what Jankélévitch terms "the absolute," within totality ("the closed") is understood as the advent of beatitude and deliverance by which human existence is elevated and exalted to a defied condition of humanity. This transformative experience of transcendence struggles against the tragedy of life which underpins the state of closed morality and the perpetual entrapment of life by the dupe of false morality and the intellect betrayed by its own instincts. As Jankélévitch observes: "the élan of life leads to structures that deceive life such that freedom leads to a definitive choice in which it manages to make itself unrecognizable." In this manner, "life trusted the intellect in order to fully realize itself, but the intellect betrayed the hope of life" [162]. A tragic vision of human existence resonates throughout Bergson's conception of closed morality and religion. But it is precisely against this tragic condition of life's self-betrayal that Jankélévitch identifies both the vital significance and the daunting challenge of Bergson's thinking. For, on the one hand, Bergson's thinking, despite this insistence on the tragedy of evolution, does not represent a "treatise on despair." On the contrary: "To unhappy modernity's tragic saltus responds Bergson's joyous instant, which is, at the summit of the soul, the calm and entirely gracious intuition of an absolute" [209]. Yet, on the other hand, as Jankélévitch remarks in an off-hand rebuke of his own intellectual milieu,

it is this basic optimism that explains the disaffection toward the greatest philosopher of the twentieth century that today reigns among the frivolous and the violent. Perhaps for the first time in the history of doctrines, mobilism no longer explains the unhappy condition of the creature. [204]

This insistence on Bergson's optimism and his ethics of generosity and beatitude, as a condition "beyond opposites" that grasps in one vitalizing motion the simplicity and joy of productive contradictions, returns in Jankélévitch's illuminating essay "Bergsonism and Judaism." He underlines in this peerless treatment of Bergson's affinities with the "Biblical consciousness" of Judaism the distance that separates Bergson's thinking from a philosophical modernity obsessed with the tragic finitude of human existence. In what must be seen as an oblique critique of Heidegger (more fully developed, albeit always veiled, in his 1930 L'Alternative, in which Bergson finds, as he writes in his letter of 1939, a "singularly captivating" study of boredom), Jankélévitch argues that

foreign to any form of tragic pathos, Bergson does not see in death the absurdity of nonbeing to which the individual ipseity is incomprehensibly doomed: death is not an encounter between a supernatural destiny and a trivial physical contingency that abruptly ends our career. [226]

It is a theme, death, that he would more fully address in his 1966 La Mort -- a magistral work that remains entirely neglected. Death is not the veritable discontinuity, or genuine experience of transcendence, within the becoming of duration. Rather than consider death as an ontological event, as the passage from being to non-being, the deliverance from death and its despair is promised through an instant of joy and blessedness in time. To live above death is to live the eternal in time; it is to grasp duration as continuous springtime. Jankélévitch does not shy from explicitly proposing an essential affinity between Bergson's "open morality/religion" and Judaism. As he observes: "Maybe we should understand in this way the living God of Psalms, Isaiah, and Exodus, that is to say, the idea of a God that is perpetual spring and renewal. Is not the Bergsonian god itself the élan of continuous creation, the wonder of every minute?" [226]. In a further remark that must have surely riled many of Bergson's detractors and advocates, he boldly speaks of the "catholicity" of Judaism as "even more open than that of Roman Catholicism, as it attaches no denominational conditions to salvation, no specific creed" [230]. The open religion of the Talmud affirms a "universal fraternity" without respect of nationality or regard for "the contingent distinguishing marks that differentiate the individual from the human being." In fact, Judaism only becomes denominational when it "imitates Catholicism and closes in on itself in opposition to other faiths" [230]. What unites Bergson and Judaism is this promise of a deliverance from the tragic "curse of a circuit that loops back on itself" [232]. This beatitude to come and redeeming time of the nations is animated by the simplicity of a vision encapsulated in the gratitude of joy. "For the word 'Joy' is as important in Bergson as it is in the Prophets. The joy that makes men dance, the joy of a glorious tomorrow, does it not above all belong to deliverance, that is to say, to the operation of freedom?" [245]