Henry Sidgwick

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Harrison, Ross, (ed.), Henry Sidgwick, Oxford University Press, 2001, 110pp, $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 01972629X.

Reviewed by Alasdair MacIntyre, University of Notre Dame


Henry Sidgwick had a major part in founding the British Academy, although he died two years before its foundation. In recognition of this, the Academy sponsored a conference on his work in the year 2000 to mark the hundredth anniversary of his death. This book consists of revised versions of the papers given to that conference, together with the commentaries that were presented. The papers are by Stefan Collini on ‘My Roles and their Duties: Sidgwick as Philosopher, Professor, and Public Moralist’, by John Skorupski on ‘Three Methods and a Dualism’, and by Ross Harrison, who also contributes an Introduction, on ‘The Sanctions of Utilitarianism’. The commentators are Jonathan Rée, Onora O’Neill, and Roger Crisp.

The publication of collections of conference papers has resulted in more bad books than it is agreeable to think about. This by contrast is a very good book, a model of lucid, economical and at times elegant prose, and of incisive and illuminating argument. The commentators deserve special praise. Each has only six or seven pages, but each says something of genuine importance and does so compellingly.

Let me begin with Harrison’s paper. Sidgwick’s enquiry into the sanctions of utilitarianism has as its starting-point Bentham’s discussion, and Harrison compares the views of Bentham and Mill with those of Sidgwick. Sidgwick in Chapter 5 of Book II of the Methods of Ethics expressed strong doubts as to whether a rational egoist would be sufficiently moved by the sanctions of positive law, of public opinion, or of conscience to conform to the requirements of impersonal duty in those situations in which self–interest is at odds with those requirements. Harrison, while doing justice to the complexity of Sidgwick’s account of sanctions both in this and in other passages, concludes that Sidgwick’s problems about sanctions are generated not by considerations directly arising from the nature of those sanctions, but by what Sidgwick called the dualism of practical reason. And up to a point Harrison endorses Sidgwick’s view of this dualism: “Sidgwick’s (and before him Butler’s) claim seems to me to be highly plausible; namely that we recognize as… . ultimate reasons [for action] that something is in someone’s interest (or leads to their happiness) and also that something is in the general interest (or benefits someone else)” (p.107).

Sidgwick had recognized that the prospects of pleasure and pain, which on both Bentham’s and Mill’s views are fundamental to every type of sanction, may on occasion not motivate us to act in our own self-interest, let alone as the general happiness requires, and so Harrison concludes that “If ‘sanctions’ just means what can (rationally) motivate me, then either of these considerations can provide sanctions, that is, reasons”, but that “if ‘sanction’ means an immediate anticipation of pleasure and pain, then neither reason will directly follow from such sanctions” (p. 107).

Harrison, unlike Sidgwick, finds this view untroubling. What most troubled Sidgwick was his inability to escape the conclusion not just that there are two ultimate principles of practical reason, that which prescribes those actions that will serve self-interest and that which prescribes those actions that will serve the general happiness, but that, on occasion, to conform to the one will violate the other. Harrison comments: “So they possibly diverge. However, because these are truths of practical rather than speculative reason, this should not matter. The two may diverge. All this shows is that, if they do, we are not in the best of all possible worlds” (p.114) And, insofar as it is in their power, benevolent legislators will impose sanctions designed to make the actions prescribed by these two principles coincide.

Crisp’s commentary focuses on questions about motivation. Harrison quotes Sidgwick as saying that “when I speak of the cognition or judgment that ‘X ought to be done’–in the stricter ethical sense of the term ought–as a ‘dictate’ or ‘precept’ of reason… I imply that in rational beings as such this cognition gives an impulse or motive to action” (Book I, Chapter 3), but Crisp notes that Sidgwick goes on to remark that “this is only one motive among others… and not always a predominant motive.” Sidgwick was an internalist, but one who held that the motive provided by moral judgment is often insufficient, and that, says Crisp, “leaves plenty of room for discussion of sanctions” (p.121). Crisp also suggests that Sidgwick’s may have been an empirical rather than a conceptual internalism, so opening up further the question of what, on Sidgwick’s view, the relationship of motives to reasons is.

Skorupski’s central claim is that Sidgwick in fact identified three and not just two ultimate principles of practical reason. The third is that enjoining impartiality, which Sidgwick took himself to have discovered in Kant: ‘That whatever is right for me must be right for all persons in similar circumstances.’ Skorupski takes only this to be a principle of pure practical reason, since “neither the reason-giving form of prudence nor that of morality is reducible to pure practical reason” (p.66). These derive instead from a particular understanding of sentiments, in the case of morality, blame, in the case of prudence, desire. Skorupski argues against Sidgwick that we have a wide variety of reasonable feelings that afford us reason to act, that the reasons advanced by the egoist are merely a subclass of these, and that both morality and the impartiality principle have authority to overrule such reasons.

Yet here, as Skorupski is well aware, more argument is needed and this especially on two counts. First Skorupski’s argument rests upon his own view of the moral psychology of feeling, judgment and action and he has to show us why his moral psychology is superior to Sidgwick’s, that is, he has to turn to some of the questions raised by Crisp. Skorupski’s view was developed at greater length in his Explorations in Ethics (Oxford University Press, 1999), but even there Skorupski does not address the kind of objections to his view that Sidgwick might have advanced. We also need from Skorupski a fuller treatment of the principle of impartiality. For in a sufficiently weak version, that principle, as Sidgwick saw, can be accepted by a rational egoist (p.67). Since Skorupski holds that the principle of impartiality has a kind of authority which egoism does not have, he presumably has in mind some stronger version of the principle, but he does not tell us what it is.

O’Neill in her commentary makes two points. The first concerns the insufficiency of Sidgwick’s account of practical reason, an account that “supplies no more than universal generalisation and instrumental rationality” (p.88). Practical reason thus conceived “underdetermines not only ethical judgment, but also the methods and principles of ethics” (p.88). The dualism of which Sidgwick spoke is not a dualism of practical reason, but a dualism of intuited ends, of the ends set by the prospect of my own happiness and the ends set by the prospect of the general happiness.

It was his conclusion that reason has no way of adjudicating between these two, on those occasions in which they conflict, that was responsible for what O’Neill calls the “lingering sadness” of so much of Sidgwick’s later writing. She herself sees one source of Sidgwick’s predicament in his misreading of Kant. And she contrasts with Sidgwick’s understanding of the universalisability principle “Kant’s explicit view that practical reason asks what principles can or cannot be willed or adopted by all agents and that “reasons (whatever else they may be) must be followable by those to whom they are addressed”(p.89). There are, that is to say, constraints on what rational agents can will either with regard to their own happiness or to that of others. And the absence of those constraints from Sidgwick’s account leaves him with an inadequate and a disappointed conception of both the scope and the authority of practical reasoning.

Stefan Collini provides an illuminating description of Sidgwick’s conception of his role as a professor of philosophy and of his duties in the various roles that he occupied. Harrison in his Introduction reminds us of how much of Cambridge University’s institutionalized structure was reshaped by committees in whose work Sidgwick had a leading part, and, more especially, of Sidgwick’s achievement in helping to make it possible for women to study at Cambridge. To this Collini adds, among other things, an account of his contributions to the work of Royal Commissions on subjects as various as secondary education and local taxation. But what Collini rightly stresses is the extent to which Sidgwick understood his public vocation to be that of communicating what he took to be the truths arrived at by his study of moral and politics and his austere interpretation of that vocation.

The conservatism of Sidgwick’s politics has been discussed by Collini in an earlier paper (‘The ordinary experience of civilized life: Sidgwick’s politics and the method of reflection analysis’ in Essays on Henry Sidgwick ed. B. Schultz, Cambridge University Press, 1992). That conservatism found expression in his limited view of the moral philosopher’s role, a view that contrasts sharply with Mill’s. Sidgwick was not interested in addressing the many, but only a select few. Collini quotes from a journal entry in 1884: “I would not if I could, and I could not if I would, say anything which would make philosophy—my philosophy—popular.”

Collini suggests that Sidgwick’s intended audience was a relatively small group of “thoughtful and moral persons” (Sidgwick’s phrase), “a tightly knit group of ethically motivated men” (Collini’s gloss on Sidgwick), who might provide moral leadership for the presumably less cultivated and less motivated mass of human beings, “a kind of moral vanguardism” (p.28). And this may provide part of the answer to a question posed by Collini: “how was it that this exceptionally clever and, by all accounts, delightful man managed, in some of his later writings, to be so heart-sinkingly boring?” (p43).

Jonathan Rée in his commentary responds by distinguishing prose that is boring “because of the lack of skill and self-discipline on the part of the author” from prose that is boring “because it has been deliberately deprived of affect,” as if for fear of “embarrassing emotion” (p.52). Yet perhaps what Sidgwick feared was not embarrassment. It was rather that his readers or hearers might be moved by something other than the weight of his argument. If this is right, the boring quality of Sidgwick’s prose is one more testimony to his integrity.

Sidgwick was not boring in conversation. His great-niece, who attended the British Academy conference, told Jonathan Rée that he was known for joking word-play of a kind that became known as ‘Sidgwickedness’; Bryce talked of his “sweet and kindly wit.” And Sidgwick, commenting in his journal on Charles Lamb’s remark that he “could have written the plays of Shakespeare if he had a mind to,” said that “I feel as if I could have worked out a false system as good as—say—the Kritik of Pure Reason, if I had thought it worthwhile.” So the suppression of wit in Sidgwick’s philosophical prose suggests deliberate and strategic intention. Happily the contributors to this book have in this respect not followed Sidgwick.