Heraclitus: The Inception of Occidental Thinking; and, Logic: Heraclitus's Doctrine of the Logos

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Martin Heidegger, Heraclitus: The Inception of Occidental Thinking; and, Logic: Heraclitus's Doctrine of the Logos, Julia Goesser Assaiante and S. Montgomery Ewegen (trs.), Bloomsbury, 2018, 309pp., $43.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780826462411.

Reviewed by Richard Capobianco, Stonehill College


It is arguable that the core of the later Heidegger's thinking on "being" (often written as "Being" in the Heidegger scholarship) may be found in his commentaries on Parmenides, Heraclitus, and Anaximander from his extraordinarily creative period of the 1940s. Admittedly, Heidegger's readings of these earliest Greek thinkers are highly speculative -- and they continue to provoke scholarly challenges -- yet what is undeniable is their originality and brilliance. Heidegger found in the fragments of these early thinkers a manifold of "names" for being itself (Sein selbst): physis, alētheia, zoē, hen, kosmos, apeiron, the primordial Logos, and so forth. For Heidegger, each of these Greek Ur-words named the earliest and most fundamental Western understanding of "being" as the unitary temporal unfolding of all things, that is, being-as-time or, we might also say, the being-way. As he saw it, this originary understanding of being was later eclipsed or "forgotten" as Western thinking devolved into a thinking of being principally in terms of the timeless and changeless, namely, as eidos, idea, morphē, essentia, essence. Thus, in his view, the urgent "task" for thinking in the present day is to recall and recover the earliest Greek experience and thinking of being and thereby to rename it in a new and refreshed manner; hence, also his own terms of art, Ereignis, Lichtung, and Es gibt, all names for being itself.

Heidegger's sparkling lecture courses on Heraclitus from 1943 and 1944 were published in his Collected Works (Gesamtausgabe) in 1979 as Volume 55 (edited by the late Manfred Frings), but it has taken these many years for an English translation to appear.[1] It is a formidable task, and the translators do a commendable job of rendering Heidegger's difficult and dense text into readable English. Yet there are some infelicities, and the most glaring and unfortunate is the grammatical lapse throughout the text with all such renderings as "the word of Heraclitus's" and "the sayings of Heraclitus's."

The translators make a noble effort to carry over into English Heidegger's play on the German words; but in some cases, they try too hard, and the plain sense of the text goes astray. For instance, in elucidating Heraclitus's fragment 123, Heidegger refers to "the rising and setting of the sun" (the German words Aufgehen and Untergehen) to highlight the intertwining of "unconcealment" and "concealment" in being as physis. The translators elect to carry this root-word play into English with the pair of words "emergence" for Aufgehen and "submergence" for Untergehen -- but with the unhappy result that the text has Heidegger frequently speaking about "the submerging of the sun" rather than simply "the setting of the sun."

Also regrettable is the poor production value of this softcover volume. The book has the appearance of a print-on-demand publication: the print is small and the font unappealing; the spacing of the sections is awkward; and the lines are crowded on the page. The translation deserved better than this from the publisher. In any case, what is more important is that these lecture courses are finally available to Anglophone readers and scholars.

Indeed, these lecture courses are brimming with engaging reflections on the meaning and significance of the fragments of Heraclitus. In the 1943 lecture course (all translations that follow are my own), Heidegger unfolds at length how physis was but another name for "being" (the Greek word einai and the word on in its participial form and verbal sense). Heraclitus and the earliest Greeks experienced physis as being as "the pure emerging," and for them, all beings and things -- "mountain and sea, plant and animal, houses and human beings, gods and heaven" -- emerged from out of this pure emerging. Furthermore, the Greeks experienced everything as "living" (zoē) insofar as everything emerges from out of the pure emerging itself. And since this pure emerging or unconcealing was also named by the Greeks as alētheia, the Greek Ur-words physis, zoē, alētheia all say "the same" (das Selbe) and illuminate, each name in a somewhat different manner, being itself.

Heidegger continues with a long excursus on Heraclitus's fragment 123 (physis kryptesthai philei, traditionally translated into English as "Nature loves to hide"), and he offers his distinctive reading that being as physis as alētheia is never fully transparent to us. All emergence is fraught with "concealment," which is his signature way of saying that the emergence and shining-forth of things is never exhausted by our thinking and saying, our sense or meaning. "Concealment" is the unconquerable reserve of being that was brought to language by the earliest Greeks in the lēthe of alētheia and the kryptesthai of Heraclitus's fragment 123.

Also notable in this lecture course is his extended poetic philosophical reflection on being as the "fire" (pur) that allows all beings to flame up in the first place, and as the "lightning flash" (keraunos) that "steers" all beings into their proper place and relation. According to Heidegger, Heraclitus is always drawing our attention to that which enables all beings to be as they are, and as they are in relation to one another in the ensemble. The focus is away from beings or even beings as a whole, and toward being as the "inapparent harmony" (harmonia aphanes) that "shimmers ungraspably" through all beings as they emerge and unfold. This emerging and unfolding is the shining way of all beings, and this was also named by Heraclitus as kosmos. Kosmos, too, is a name for being.

Being as physis as kosmos is, as Heidegger reads Heraclitus, the "primordial emblazoning and adorning" (das ursprüngliche Schmücken und Zieren) that brings all beings into their radiant existence. His play with the language and images is itself radiant in these pages, but also overplayed, and for those who are fond of precisely this kind of Heideggerian exposition (or exhibition), the reading effort is well worthwhile. Yet to gloss the matter more plainly: Heidegger's distinction between the "apparent harmony" of all beings and the "inapparent harmony" of being (as physis as kosmos) is a reminder of his life-long concern with the "ontological difference," or simply the "difference," between being and beings.

Furthermore, this "difference" cannot be explained away, as some commentators are inclined to do, as an epistemological or transcendental-phenomenological difference between the structural conditions of knowing and the objects of knowing thus constituted. Heidegger repeatedly makes statements that point to the "metaphysical" (indeed, "ontological") character of this difference. So, for example, he emphasizes the wisdom of Heraclitus's teaching in fragment 30 that "none of the gods, as well as no one of the human beings" has brought forth being as kosmos. He adds: "It [being] is nothing made and has therefore also no determinate beginning at a point in time and no corresponding ending of its existence." And in the second lecture course, he states that being (written in this instance as Seyn, "beyng") is "imperishable, but also on the way to its own truth."

In the 1944 lecture course, Heidegger turned his attention to Heraclitus's "teaching" (not "doctrine") on "logos," and his overarching concern was to affirm the primacy of being as "the primordial Logos" (Heidegger used the capital lamda when referring to being) in "relation" to the logos (legein) of the human being. Being as the primordial Logos is the temporal "laying out" and "fore-gathering" of all things that is always prior to and exceeds any distinctively human "gathering" in language or art. Heidegger is explicit and emphatic that being as "the primordial Logos" is "indeed a kind of saying and word" and also "a kind of speech and voice" -- but certainly not "any kind of activity of human saying or stating." The primordial Logos is "expressly not the voice of a human being," he maintains. Our human task is to "hearken" in humble silence to what the primordial Logos "says" and respond in word and art, and this is the teaching of Heraclitus on the unique homologein, or "correspondence" (Entsprechung), of human beings in relation to the Logos.

There are other striking readings and tropes in both lecture courses that await the reader and which have gone largely unnoticed in the Heidegger scholarship until recently.[2] Also important is that this volume, along with other major texts from the later years, presents a central challenge to certain contemporary readings of Heidegger; namely, it puts into radical question the currently oft-repeated claim that Heidegger "overcame" metaphysics. Although it is true that Heidegger's reflections in these lecture courses bear out that he sought to move beyond a metaphysics and theology of substance; nonetheless, at the same time, they also suggest an alternatively conceived metaphysical and religious or spiritual perspective.

As we have observed, his discussion of being as physis as kosmos bears all the marks of a distinctive metaphysical position: Being as radiant, "imperishable" temporal process "on its way to its own truth" and by which, in which, and through which all individual beings are related and emerge into their own truth, linger, and pass away. Is this not a "process" metaphysics of some kind? It would seem so, but Heidegger does not tell us as much, unlike Alfred North Whitehead, for example. Still, the later Heidegger was always leaning and pressing in this direction. In the 1944 lecture course, we find him repeatedly seeking to redefine the "relation" of being and the human being. He is clearly not satisfied with the traditional classical or medieval metaphysical account of this relation, yet at the same time, in some passages, he insists on the "independence" of being in relation to the human being. In one such text, he states:

Being is in need of legein. Is being thereby dependent upon the human being, if it is the case that legein is the "human" of the human being? Here remains to question: What does "dependence" mean here? Is this dependence a degradation of being? What if being were in need of legein since it, being, is what is independent? What if this independence of being consisted in the fact that being is the originally sheltering, that is gleaning, that is gathering of everything -- the Logos? Because being is the Logos, it needs legein. [But] being needs legein for the favor of the safeguarding of being's independence. Here we are thinking in that region (in the region of the truth of beyng) where all relations are entirely different than in the field of beings.

Thus, what we have here, too, is a sketch of a metaphysical (and even theological) position that Heidegger never worked out -- or, rather, quite decidedly never wished to work out. Being is the unitary, temporal, dynamic unfolding process that is not "a being" and that is "independent" of the human being; yet being is "related" to the human being (and to all beings, "everything"), but not as "a being" to another being in the realm of beings.

Taken together, these rich and fascinating lecture courses contribute to our understanding of the content and trajectory of the later Heidegger's thinking. They also remind us that Heidegger, despite his determination to "overcome" a traditional metaphysics of substance, was, nonetheless, always in some way "on the way" toward an alternative metaphysical understanding of "being." His aim from the outset was a revised characterization of being, and the fragments of the earliest Greek thinkers Heraclitus, Parmenides, and Anaximander was his royal road to that end. Admittedly, he left us only a sketch of this new (or renewed) understanding of being, but that was entirely consistent with his hinting style and his aversion to any kind of systematic philosophical thinking. Almost fifty years after his death and after the publication of over one hundred volumes of his writings, it is evident that Heidegger's open-ended and suggestive style of thinking has led to a wide variety of readings and appropriations. And it is also undeniable that there is the Heidegger whose inkling was not to "overcome" metaphysics as such, but rather to refashion it along the lines of his distinctive vision of being.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Gesamtausgabe, Band 55: Heraklit: Der Anfang des abendländischen Denkens; Logik. Heraklits Lehre vom Logos, ed. Manfred S. Frings (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1979).

[2] For a fuller discussion of the themes in these Heraclitus lecture courses, see especially Chapters 5 and 6 of my Heidegger's Way of Being (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2014). Also, my article "Heidegger on Heraclitus: Kosmos/World as Being Itself," Epoché (Spring 2016), 20:2, 465-476.