Herbert Marcuse: A Critical Reader

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John Abromeit and W. Mark Cobb (eds.) Herbert Marcuse: A Critical Reader, Routledge, 2004. 274pp, $28.95 (pbk), ISBN: 0415289106

Reviewed by David West, Australian National University


This book offers a timely collection of readings about a thinker whose reputation has, paradoxically, suffered as much from success as from any flaws in his work. Marcuse’s status as iconic intellectual of the New Left and sixties radicals has served him badly. The New Left’s disintegration after 1968 was associated with seismic shifts in the politically engaged intellectual world. The subsequent ascendancy of poststructuralism and postmodernism is best understood as the outcome of a complex process of disillusionment with a Marxist tradition damaged by its association with failed revolution in the capitalist ’West’ and a series of moral and political debacles in the ’actually existing socialist’ countries of the ’East’ (Hungary, Czechoslovakia, Poland, the Chinese cultural revolution) before the terminal Götterdämmerung after 1989. The decline of Marxism and rise of postmodernism have together undermined some of the foundations of Marcuse’s thought and popularity. He has been damned as the proponent of a ’totalising’ political project of Hegelian and Marxist heritage. An allegedly naïve liberationist politics relied on his uncritically biological and ’essentialist’ reading of Freudian instinct theory. At the same time, Marcuse’s lack of faith in the proletariat and others symptoms of Western-Marxist revisionism have denied him any sanctuary in the remaining redoubts of the Marxist intelligentsia. Needless to say, the hostility of orthodox liberal academia towards an intellectual whose ideas helped to inspire a generation of student radicals and activists was not in doubt.

Some of the most useful contributions of this volume, therefore, are its direct and indirect challenges to this reception of Marcuse’s ideas. At the same time, the authors seek to avoid any uncritical ’Marcuse nostalgia’, attempting instead to follow Angela Davis’s advice to ’incorporate his ideas into a historical memory that draws upon the useful aspects of the past in order to put them to work in the present’ (50). So, for example, as John Abromeit and W. Mark Cobb acknowledge in their excellent introductory survey, we can now see Marcuse’s call for the civil rights of the Right to be curtailed as symptomatic of a certain ’democratic deficit’ in his thinking (24). On the other hand, his sceptical assessment of the ’repressive tolerance’ of western liberal democracies is more relevant than ever. Toleration in the West has often co-existed with a disturbing degree of self-belief. After all, the Protestants of America and Britain only abandoned Locke’s assumption that Catholics, of course, could not be tolerated, when their loyalty to the Pope could no longer represent any conceivable threat. The retreat of tolerance in the aftermath of the events of 9/11 surely supports Marcuse’s pessimistic assessment. Similarly, his warnings about the dangers of an uncontrollable ’performance principle’ allied with technological reason, which made sense in the dark moments of the Vietnam War, make sense once again with the renewed militancy of the American Empire. From the other end of the political spectrum, the castigation of Marcuse from the perspective of an axiomatic Marxist faith in imminent working-class revolution is less convincing than ever – a fact reflected in Cobb’s understandably angry demolition of a polemical ’tirade’ that Alasdair MacIntyre would presumably prefer to forget (165-76).

Perhaps more surprisingly, as Cobb’s similarly polemical engagement with Foucault and Rorty suggests, Marcuse has been misunderstood even by fellow academics who have more reason to be aware of their own intellectual ’will to power’. There is some irony in the fact that philosophers of the nineteen-eighties and -nineties who were significantly inspired by Nietzsche and Heidegger have failed to recognise or acknowledge a similar inspiration in Marcuse. In this context, the essays by Andrew Feenberg, John Abromeit and Gérard Raulet usefully explore Marcuse’s early but formative encounter with Heidegger and phenomenology. This influence is most obvious in Marcuse’s dissertation, Hegel’s Ontology and the Theory of Historicity, published in Seyla Benhabib’s translation only in 1987. As Abromeit suggests, by the early 1930s Marcuse had already been repelled by Heidegger’s open[ly] Nazi sympathies and shifted his philosophical attention to Hegel and the early Marx (138-43). But Marcuse’s Heideggerian suspicion of technology and technological reason remained a persistent feature of his thought. This helps to account for the difference between Marcuse – closer in this respect to Horkheimer and Adorno – and Habermas on the nature of scientific rationality. Habermas has famously criticized Marcuse’s occasional utopian anticipations of a ’new science’ more receptive to the subjectivity of nature, arguing instead, in Samir Gandesha’s words, ’that the ideological nature of technology (and science) inheres not in its orientation towards controlling nature, but rather in the transgression of the boundary of its own sphere of value’ (200).

Although Habermas probably has the better of that particular argument, Marcuse’s technological ’Romanticism’ has perhaps proved to be politically the more fertile position. Habermas’s seeming distance and ambivalence towards environmental politics contrasts with the continuing resonance of Marcuse’s early ecological concerns, addressed in a section of this volume concerned with ’Marcuse and Contemporary Ecological Theory’. Here Tim Luke briefly explores a number of ecological themes in Marcuse’s thought. Andrew Light carefully situates Marcuse as a helpful bridge between the opposing factions of ’deep’ and ’social’ ecology, although he then abandons this promising terrain for the sake of a more urgent and pragmatically focused engagement on behalf of the environment (231-5). Steven Vogel explores the tensions between Marcuse’s occasional seeming sympathy with naturalism and, on the other hand, his clear recognition that nature is socially constructed. The latter sits more easily with his emphasis on the prospects for an imaginative, creative-aesthetic transformation of nature and human sensibility. Marcuse’s scientific utopianism is ultimately glossed as the more defensible (but perhaps less inspiring) insistence on the need for a philosophy ’that self-consciously acknowledge[s] human responsibility for the environment’ (243-5).

In retrospect, Marcuse’s writings seem particularly prescient for their sensitivity to issues of gender and sexuality. Like Adorno and Horkheimer in their Dialectic of Enlightenment, but far less cryptically, Marcuse’s thought accommodates a wide range of what are now clearly recognised as feminist issues and concerns. Some of the inadequacies of Marcuse’s ’maternal ethic’ are canvassed in a difficult chapter by John O’Neill. Douglas Kellner shows how some related themes of poststructuralism play a fundamental role in Marcuse’s philosophy, which develops a view of ’embodied subjectivity in which the opposition between reason and the senses, central to the modern philosophical concept of the subject, is deconstructed’ (88). In contrast to the dominant philosophical tradition’s conception of an abstract, disembodied and universal subject, Marcuse insists that human beings are ’corporeal, gendered, social, fractured, and historical’ (81). Kellner also argues that Marcuse’s idea of a ’libidinal rationality’ can be reconstructed without relying on the more questionable aspects of Freudian instinct theory (86). Although this idea of a libidinal rationality was no more than an anticipation in Marcuse’s writings, his broader contributions to sexual politics also continue to resonate – despite the critical impact of Foucault’s History of Sexuality. Properly understood, it seems clear that both theorists are alike in rejecting a naïve naturalism of sexual instincts or biological human essence, both are aware of the dangers of ’playing into the hands of power’ or what Marcuse termed ’repressive desublimation’. In the end, both thinkers should be recognised as important contributors to the politics of sexuality.

Overall, this collection of essays testifies to the continuing relevance and interest of Marcuse’s thought. Marcuse’s qualities as both an intellectual and activist who maintained an always close relationship with social developments and political practice throughout a long and productive life are clearer than ever. This is reflected in the personal recollections of Peter Marcuse and Carl E. Schorske included in this volume. It is, perhaps, also appropriate that this testimonial to the critical historical memory of an important critical theorist is itself neither tidy nor definitive. This book came about as a result of an international conference held in 1998 at the University of California, Berkeley, in order to commemorate the centenary of Herbert Marcuse’s birth. Like many collections of this kind, and despite taking somewhat ’longer than expected’ to reach its present form, this book retains some of the unevenness of quality and approach that characterizes even the best organised conference. Some dense, scholarly articles co-exist with short, almost conversational pieces. Careful and informative discussions by the editors and many of the contributing voices, both ’veteran’ and ’new’, appear alongside sometimes (at least to my taste) unnecessarily obscure, sometimes directionless essays. Intriguing hypotheses about critical theory’s American experience and Marcuse’s neglect of the mystical origins of matriarchy are not clearly resolved. This may not reflect on the ultimate value of the theses proposed, but it does somewhat qualify this book’s implicit claim to provide an even and balanced review of Marcuse’s legacy. That said, Marcuse: A Critical Reader will not only prove valuable reading for scholars of Marcuse but should also, and more importantly, reinforce the case for once again taking a serious academic and political interest in the thought of Herbert Marcuse.