Herder: Philosophy and Anthropology

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Anik Waldow and Nigel deSouza (eds.), Herder: Philosophy and Anthropology, Oxford University Press, 2017, 266 pp., $75.00, ISBN 9780198779650.

Reviewed by Rachel Zuckert, Northwestern University


This collection of essays on Herder's philosophical-anthropological thought is arranged in two parts: "Towards a New Philosophy: Philosophy as Anthropology," including pieces by Charles Taylor, Marion Heinz, Nigel DeSouza, Stefanie Buchenau, Stephen Gaukroger, and Dalia Nassar, and "The Human Animal: Nature, Language, History, Culture," including essays by John Zammito, Anik Waldow, Kristin Gjesdal, Johannes Schmidt, Martin Bollacher, Michael Forster, and Frederick Beiser. As the part titles and the title of the volume suggest, many of the essays treat Herder's philosophical methodology as well as his characteristic subject matters. Herder himself argues that philosophy should focus on the human being or (in his terms) be "anthropology." His philosophical practice, pursuing this focus, also in fact proves to be rather close to what we currently mean by anthropology: philosophy must be informed by empirical information about linguistic and cultural diversity; it must respect -- both theoretically take into account and practically value -- human diversity in its manifold culturally specific forms.

These titles are also in a way misleading, however. For I would say that the center of gravity of the volume is Herder's naturalism, that is (put generally), his treatment of the human being as animal, as fully part of the natural, organic world, comprehensible and evaluable in terms of natural forces or powers (its own and others), as they are constrained, influenced, stimulated, by differing environments. Four of the physically central essays in the volume -- those by Bucheanu, Gaukroger, Zammito, and Waldow -- endorse this interpretive approach to Herder's philosophy (which has been established and promoted in large part through Zammito's prior work). Most of the other essays also touch upon it, for example, incorporating some naturalistic elements within a broadly non-naturalistic metaphysics (DeSouza), considering how Herderian religious commitments may fit with (some form of) naturalism (Schmidt), or deploying it to criticize Enlightenment conceptions of human rights (Forster). And some contributions contest or complicate this interpretative approach. Consistently with his previous work (on Herder and beyond), Taylor takes Herder to operate in accord with a more social-scientific or humanistic form of "good naturalism" (p. 25), emphasizing not the organic nature of human beings, but rather their empirical situatedness within diverse cultures. Similarly, and like Taylor inspired by later (not especially naturalistic) developments in German philosophy, Gjesdal and Nassar suggest (in different ways) that Herder may indeed conceive of human beings within nature, but in light of a more humanistically oriented, perhaps one could say more Romantic conception of nature -- a "poetic" view (Gjesdal) or a Goethean descriptivist view (Nassar) -- than the term "naturalism" tends to connote today.

This collection does much of what one would like a collection of essays to do. First, and importantly, it provides a nice, representative cross-section of Herder scholarship today, including pieces by established scholars whose work initiated and promoted philosophical scholarship on Herder -- such as Taylor, Heinz, Bollacher, Zammito, Forster, and Beiser -- as well as contributions from newer scholars (or scholars newer to Herder). It correspondingly treats many central themes in Herder's philosophical corpus, and does so from differing perspectives. For example, Johannes Schmidt emphasizes Herder's religious commitments and elaborates a Herderian understanding of human beings as essentially religious, and of religion as essentially humanistic (with careful attention to the texts, as well as to the distinction between religiosity in general and Protestant Christianity in particular). Nigel DeSouza builds upon (and helps to introduce to an English-speaking audience) Marion Heinz's work Sensualistischer Idealismus: Untersuchungen zur Erkennrtnistheorie und Metaphysik des jungen Herder (1763-1778) (Felix Meiner, 1994). DeSouza presents Herder as a monistic metaphysician -- all is, ultimately, force -- who in his treatment of human nature nonetheless privileges the soul or "thought-force," as that which "builds itself a body by harnessing the forces of attraction and repulsion in matter" (pp. 63-64). And Herder's well-known recognition of cultural diversity and corresponding resistance to Enlightenment universalism are approached from several points of view: for example, as comprising moral relativism (Forster), as proto-hermeneutical (Gjesdal), and as promoting intra- as well as international cultural diversity (Beiser, in an excellent, textually well-grounded, argumentatively balanced treatment of Herder's response to the "Jewish question").

The main exception to the representativeness of the range of topics here is Herder's deep interest in aesthetic and artistic phenomena, which, though mentioned in passing in several essays (most extensively in Gaukroger), are given short shrift in a way that is unrepresentative of Herder's own commitments. (The vast majority of his early works, in which he developed most of his central philosophical positions and impulses, are in aesthetics; one would not gather that from this collection.) I note too that different editorial decisions would have made the collection more helpful to readers, especially those aiming to gain an orientation in Herder scholarship. More consistency in the citations of Herder's works across essays (e.g., common editions cited, or at least consistent abbreviations thereof) would put less burden on readers, and a common bibliography would have provided a better sense of the range of scholarship drawn upon here. As it stands, each essay has its own bibliography, except the Beiser essay, which oddly lacks one altogether.

These are minor problems, however, when weighed against the substantive strengths of the collection. It not only represents the -- encouragingly flourishing -- state of scholarship on Herder, as noted, but also contributes fruitfully to that discussion, both in providing informative historical contextualization of Herder's views (Herder was a thinker deeply engaged with the thought of his contemporaries) and in raising interesting philosophical and interpretive questions. Bollacher discusses Herder's philosophy of history within the German reception of Voltaire and the French Revolution, for example, while Heinz continues her examination (begun in other work) of Herder's relation to the German rationalist tradition. Here she focuses on Herder's conception of philosophy as anthropology (which she interprets to mean empirical psychology, as it does for Kant, but also thereby as an ontology of the soul, as psychology is for Christian Wolff), and argues that philosophy is thereby rendered both an intellectual pursuit valuable in itself and a useful pedagogical instrument for the people at large (as Herder wishes for it to be, in part in opposition to the rationalists).

Most illuminating (at least for this reader) are Zammito's and Buchenau's discussions of two influential historical contexts for Herder's naturalist claims. Zammito argues persuasively that Herder's characterization of the human being (in his Treatise on the Origin of Language, henceforth abbreviated OL) as the animal that lacks instincts -- and therefore needs language to orient itself in its environment -- aims to respond not only to his oft-discussed interlocutors on the origin of language (Condillac and Rousseau), but also to Hermann Samuel Reimarus' treatise on animal instinct (Allgemeine Betrachtungen über die Triebe der Thiere, hauptsächlich über ihre Kunsttriebe of 1760). Zammito contends that Herder's OL discussion repeats Reimarus' view concerning the difference between human beings and animals, but with an important addition. Reimarus had not explained the difference (as Moses Mendelssohn had pointed out), Zammito tells us, and Herder aims to remedy this problem by referring to "a fundamental difference in environmental situatedness" (p. 137). Other animals are directed to particular behaviors, or to/away from particular objects, because they live within set environmental niches; because human beings are instead oriented to a "global" environment, they are not directed innately to specific behaviors. This is a transformative reading of the OL, which places far greater theoretical weight than is usually done on the role of environment in Herder's understanding of organisms (and human organisms).

In her outstanding essay, Buchenau similarly treats Herder in the context of a now lesser-known debate, that about Albrecht von Haller's discoveries concerning muscular irritability. On Buchenau's presentation, these discoveries contributed to a competition between philosophy and medicine (which is the more important discipline for understanding the human being?) and posed serious conceptual difficulties for an understanding of the relationship between soul and body. Because Haller showed that irritability is an involuntary cause of motion distinct from causes of voluntary motion, Buchenau argues, his view "seriously threatens the Aristotelian idea of the soul as the animating principle of the body, as the principle of motion and life"; it looks like there must be two (or more) such forces, two such animating principles (of voluntary vs. involuntary motion) (p. 79). Herder's genealogical accounts of the mind -- particularly in On Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul -- may then be seen as attempts to reinstate something like the Aristotelian view in light of Haller's discoveries, Buchenau argues. If the "higher" mental functions of reason and will develop out of the "lower" functions of irritability (and then sensibility), we may continue to see the soul as the (global) animating principle of the body. But the soul is now understood as having a range of rather distinct capacities that develop over time, out of a more primitive, unconscious, and involuntary force. This article is a fascinating discussion of Herder's naturalist conception of mind, provides a deft explanation of the reasons behind his choice of genealogical method (at least in this case), and thereby, more broadly, presents a case study of how naturalist philosophy can incorporate and interpret scientific discoveries.

This brings me to the second strength of the volume: the way in which this combination of essays contributes to the maturity of Herder scholarship by raising focused, interesting philosophical questions concerning Herder, particularly his naturalism. (Individual essays also, of course, raise questions on particular points, in ways I cannot discuss here.) In particular, as noted above, the Buchenau, Gaukroger, Zammito, and Waldow contributions focus most direct attention on Herder's naturalist treatment of human beings as animals within the natural world, and thus (I now add) as continuous with and informed by natural scientific modes of inquiry, especially biology. The combination of these four essays not only stakes out a position vis-à-vis other approaches to Herder (e.g., as historicist or as religious thinker), but also deepens the scholarly discussion of Herder as naturalist: the essays richly elaborate aspects of Herderian naturalism, provoke questions concerning its precise character, and display some of the challenges of working out such an interpretation.

As just mentioned, Buchenau interprets Herder's naturalism as (in some sense) reductive (all organic functions, including higher human functions, develop out of a "lower" basic force of irritation), while Zammito argues that a specific orientation to environment is meant to explain the human-animal difference. Gaukroger and Waldow propose somewhat conflicting views on both points. In his reading of the OL discussion, Gaukroger notes, also with good textual justification, that on Herder's view human beings develop language because they (unlike other animals) need it to survive (p. 99). Human beings are thus to be understood analogously to animals -- as operating in ways needed to survive -- but not as acting in ways that may be reduced to or derived from other organic forces; rather, human behavior expresses quite different forces, mobilizes (perhaps radically) different capacities.

In the essay that most aims to integrate various aspects of Herderian naturalism, including his insistent use of empirical cultural-historical facts to understand human beings, Waldow argues that on Herder's account the environment functions (only) as a constraint. Environment is formative of human capacities, specifically of the shape or contents of human reasoning, and thereby also of human action and the history made of it, but it is not itself explanatory of the humanness of human behavior. In her investigation of the conditions of the human as naturalistically considered, Waldow, like Gaukroger, also emphasizes, interestingly, the ways in which language not only allows one to navigate complex environments by picking out general features -- a central and widely recognized aspect of linguistic reflectiveness on Herder's view -- but also the way in which its linear structure facilitates a certain free reorganization, a rethinking rather than mere imitation, of previously received sensuous elements. This capacity for reorganization of the sensible given through language, she proposes, grounds human freedom, even as human beings are still understood within a generally naturalist account.

These four essays thus together raise focused, important questions concerning central elements in Herderian naturalism: is environment (and/or human orientation thereto) explanatory or (mere) constraint? Is human functioning to be traced back to some basic organic origin, or is it sufficient (for the purposes of Herderian philosophical naturalism) to treat it as analogous to other animal functions? Are humans distinctive animals for Herder because more malleable (by their environments) or because more self-directing (free)? Is there an overarching theoretical approach that can integrate these proposals? For which conception(s) would Herder's endorsed naturalist methods, such as comparative physiology or genetic explanation, be best suited? And so forth. This confrontation of alternative emphases and interpretations thus refines and articulates the various theoretical options and potential oppositions, and this is precisely what one hopes for in a collection of this kind, on which further conversation can build.