Heritage, Culture, and Politics in the Postcolony

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Daniel Herwitz, Heritage, Culture, and Politics in the Postcolony, Columbia University Press, 2012, 232pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231160186.

Reviewed by Michael Marder, IKERBASQUE/University of the Basque Country, Vitoria-Gasteiz


Reflections on tradition, inheritance, and collective memory have been a staple of late modernity. Amidst accelerating technological changes, global displacements of immigrant or refugee populations, and shifting socio-political realities, the current techniques of historical interpretation are subject to an equally dramatic transformation. Just when it seems that the past, thanks to the possibility of its instantaneous recording, is completely within our control, it slips from our grasp because the immense archive lacks either coherence or narrative organization. Given this disarray, there is no choice but to engage in a highly selective construction of the past, actively made and remade from the fragmentary materials at our disposal. This is how inheritance, traditionally passed down from one generation to another, turns into heritage, forged by those who claim it as their own.

The theme of heritage is also philosophically significant in light of the so-called closure of metaphysics, corresponding to the condition of late modernity and, as we shall see, postcoloniality. On Heidegger's reading, the finite history of metaphysics comes to a close when every possibility for naming and misnaming Being has been exhausted. In the realm of contemporary thinking "after metaphysics," selectivity is paramount; it is a matter of choosing with care and molding afresh the heritage of past philosophizing. Rather than decisively break with the history of metaphysics, we take stock of that history and survey what remains of its great conceptual systems. There is no substitute for the painstaking work of unfolding an intellectual heritage, which has little to do with canonization and which, alone, can inspire new modes of thinking. Any attempt to start from "a clean slate" and to construct an ostensibly new system without the acute historical awareness of the entire metaphysical tradition (in other words, without a conscious or self-conscious consideration of how and why one inherits what one does) will backfire, prompting a reiteration of the crudest elements of past thought.

Daniel Herwitz's book deals with the philosophical, cultural, and political paradoxes of heritage in India, South Africa, and the United States. Yet, its scope is much broader than the title implies. Without exaggeration, I would say that this fine text bears upon the human condition in late modernity. "Heritage" is the cipher of temporalization, the process whereby the present uses bits of the past to construct its future. At the same time, Herwitz is cautious not to romanticize the practices of heritage. The point is that, in addition to bestowing the gift of identity on those who make a heritage for themselves, these practices generate a vast assortment of sellable commodities (including this very identity) immediately readied for circulation in global markets. The cost of cultural and political recognition is steep indeed; it comes with a tangible price and so alienates collective self-making the moment it is exercised. Heritage as the new figure of self-conscious human activity -- assuming bits of the past, recycling, and appropriating them -- is seamlessly integrated into the circuits of global capital.

We might question to what extent this is a uniquely American perspective on heritage, even if it applies to other postcolonial experiences. After all, Herwitz is clear that "America is the first postcolonial nation" (152) and, as such, would be expected to serve as a prototype for other instances of heritage-making. That is, perhaps, why he extrapolates from its model of a settler society to the "minting" of national character in the postcolony. In this sense, "America, South Africa, and Israel belong in the same book of heritage, in spite of the vast differences in people, society, and historical circumstance" (154). Settler heritage presents a particularly violent solution to the problem of collective identity in these diverse contexts. But it is still in tune with the active dimension of the whole enterprise, formulated in terms of taking over, reconfiguring, and appropriating the past: simply replace "the past" with "the land," and the outlines of a settler heritage will come into full view!

The other disturbing implication of this identity construction is that "intellectual heritage" cannot but reflect, in a much-diluted form, the violence that is so obvious in the perverse glorification of a settler society. Philosophical heritage, in the postcolony and outside of it, obeys the same rules of market circulation as the other commodified cultural artifacts. But what if, in turning metaphysical history into heritage, we also repeat the conceptual violence inherent in this history, with its famous marginalization and stereotyping of entire groups or classes of beings, be they human or non-human?

It bears repeating, however, that heritage is a two-edged sword. For Herwitz, postcolonial heritage "is imagined through a mixture of mimicry/assimilation and oppositional thinking" (9). The irresolvable contradiction between identity construction and marketing is here mirrored in a supplementary tension between contestation and acquiescence. Since the spaces where this conflict brews are the museum, the university, and the nation-state (16), the uneasy negotiation of heritage pertains to culture and politics alike, or, differently put, to the training of civilized subjects and the education of citizens. Hence, the first three nouns in the title of the book.

As Gayatri Spivak has it -- and Herwitz confirms between the lines of his text -- heritage becomes an integral part of postcolony's "enabling violence," a thorny path toward empowerment and emancipation that winds through and is based upon the same oppressive values and power structures that justified the colonial venture in the first place. Rather than being collected in the cultural centers of Europe, heritage items of the former colonies are now gathered in their own national museums and art galleries. From there, their local character can be globalized, as, for instance, in the case of the Indian "National Treasure" artist M.F. Husain whose works have found their market in the West (53). It is not that active and local cultural production straightforwardly supplants the passivity, with which the "exotic" artworks and artifacts of the colonized were collected and exhibited in the colony. The relative success of local production yields exactly the same objective outcome as it did in the colonial period; the loops of exchange and appropriation are expanded but not altogether undone. The enabling violence of heritage is that postcolonial experience repeats (with notable variations, to be sure) the logic of colonialism in a strange mix of recognition and commodification.

While, as I've mentioned, Herwitz avoids romanticizing postcolonial heritage, he emphasizes the romantic understanding of heritage, frequently associated with a quest for lost origins (19). To this metaphysical tendency he juxtaposes a conception of "modern art as a set of language games" devoid of "a single genesis of modern art, a single map of it adequate to the globe" (71). Sculptures from the South African regions Vha-Venda and Va-Tsonga explore the confluence of traditional art forms and colonial, apartheid modernity. The promise of heritage, then, is its dissemination, the multiplicity discernable in the concept that is intensely local, place-bound, and time-specific. Although, more often than not, heritages have a transcultural appeal, there is no such thing as the heritage, common to all cultures and societies. That is why it makes sense for Herwitz to articulate this context-bound concept par excellence with the idea of alternative modernities that, similarly, does not postulate the existence of a gold-standard European modernity, subsequently replicated in other parts of the globe.

Although Herwitz does not reference some of the philosophical sources operative in the background of his work, it is not difficult to link the critique of modernity's "single genesis" back to Derrida's deconstruction. It is equally obvious that Herwitz's notion of "live action heritage" is greatly indebted to the thought of Deleuze. Herwitz writes, "heritage games repeat past heritage games, but with a difference . . . What links the chapters that follow together is this 'logic' of difference within repetition. This 'logic' or grammar I call live action heritage" (11). In the chapter titled "Tocqueville on the Bridge to Nowhere," live action heritage in the US is divided into two distinct approaches to replaying the past: Barack Obama's staging as the twenty-first-century Lincoln and Sarah Palin's casting as the representative of small-town America. Each repeats the respective heritage with a difference appropriate to the present media and information age: Obama in the role of "a figure with the screen presence of a film star" and Palin in the capacity of "the quintessential TV actor, from sitcom, talk show, reality TV" (171). The book thus construes a sizeable chunk of the political process, at least with reference to the 2008 US presidential election, as a polemic contest between two heritages or media-packaged alternatives for inheriting "America."

Both Derridian and Deleuzian motifs in Herwitz's discussion of heritage buttress what I am tempted to term its productive undecidability. Heritage-making practices are neither intrinsically good nor bad. Their reinventions and revaluations are not available to a final and universal decision, including the decision to renounce, forget, or disavow heritage altogether. If "no decision/gesture could unravel a practice as deep in the texture of modern life as heritage" (190), then neither could we avoid this undecidability, one not to be conflated with fatalism, nihilism, or sheer resignation. This is where Herwitz's "live action" and the "productive" aspect of the expression I introduced above come in. The moral, cultural, and political undecidability of heritage enriches the present, lends it greater complexity, renders its open-ended transactions with the past prone to future contestations. And so, we come back to the parallel with philosophy at the dusk of metaphysics. Paraphrasing Herwitz on "the practices of heritage" (191), we may ask: "How to live within, while also against, the closure of metaphysics?"