Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx

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Gianni Vattimo and Santiago Zabala, Hermeneutic Communism: From Heidegger to Marx, Columbia University Press, 2011, 256pp., $27.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231158022.

Reviewed by James Swindal, Duquesne University


This is a book that in two hundred pages of text purports to inaugurate nothing short of a fundamentally new conception of Marx-inspired communism. The development of communist theories has often been stimulated by new philosophical approaches and inspirations -- this book is no exception. Vattimo and Zabala assume that one can diagnose the good and ills of a political system, and develop fresh approaches to it, on the basis of the philosophical thought that underlies it. To make their case, they draw on an array of both continental and analytic sources, such as Kant, Freud, Heidegger, Benjamin, Schmitt, Derrida, Rorty, Popper, Austin, Searle, and Chomsky -- to name a few. So their argument is targeted for someone not only well versed in the broader issues and history of communist theory but also sympathetic to a highly cognitive account of political theory generally.

Vattimo and Zabala note that their efforts are prompted by the failure of prior forms of communism to halt the continued expansion of destructive free markets throughout the world. Moreover, in their view capitalism's current worldwide system has erased any kind of "state of emergency" able to prompt change or betterment (41) -- the need for which even Heidegger recognized. Recent political events, such as the direct efforts to impose liberal democracies both by Bush in Iraq and now Obama in Afghanistan, attest to the intractable continuance of this system. Drawing from Schmitt, they criticize the liberalism that underlies our free market system within our current expanding system of what they call "framed democracies" (52). These democracies operate on the basis of a "politics of description" (53), which the authors link to a widespread tacit acceptance of a correspondence theory of truth. They link the correspondence theory both with semantic theories of truth, such as Tarski's, and metaphysical realism, such as that of Searle.

The alternative theory they offer is termed "hermeneutic communism." They define hermeneutics not, however, solely as a technique of interpretation, but more broadly as a grasp of "the whole existence of the human being" (6). This existential framework promotes, in the political realm, not a uniform equality among peoples, but a privileging of the "weak." They characterize the weak variously as the "discharge of capitalism" (7), the losers of history, and the "oblivion" of Heidegger's Sein (38). Much of this analysis of the weak extends, in a rather straightforward way, from Vattimo's previously worked out conception of "weak thought" (pensiero debole). Here it is characterized as

a theory of weakening as an interpretive sense of history, a sense that reveals itself as emancipative because of the enemies it has attracted. Weak thought can only be the thought of the weak (96).

Presumably, then, weak thought means not thinking about the weak, but taking up the way the weak think. They consider Marx himself to be a weak thinker, since he was a champion for the proletariat's desire for social and economic change.

Marx's communist theory -- to whatever extent hermeneutic -- was, however, a creature of its time; economic and social culture has since moved on. Nietzsche provides the next step in the development of hermeneutics, as signified by his famous dictum: "there are no facts, only interpretations." He was of course influenced by the social conditions of the later nineteenth century -- the increased mobility and communication among greater numbers of diverse peoples. The authors think that Nietzsche, in effect, anticipates our contemporary predicament, in which capitalist nihilism and domination force us to live as Übermenschen "capable of constructing our own alternative interpretation of the world instead of submitting to the official truths" (137).

But it was Heidegger who, by subsequently linking interpretation to the very "thrown projection" that the human being is, moved hermeneutics not in a psychological or sociological but an existential direction. Since the human has a privileged relation to Being, interpretation is linked directly to a being with a "conception of Being." But since this being is uniquely subject to time, Being is linked to history via "the event" of continual disclosure in economic, cultural, and political loci. Interpretation becomes radically destabilized, de-subjectivized, and historicized.

After Heidegger, then, hermeneutics becomes "political in itself" (77). Politics ought no longer to pretend to avoid the historicity of Being by operating with either a metaphysics that mirrors the world as it is or a moral order of rights and natural ethics. Rather, politics becomes, as Rorty indicated, a "conversation" (104) that shapes a political order based not on rule-following but toleration. Hermeneutic communism does not avoid but embraces the postmodern affirmation of alteration via Derridean "iterability" (34). This serves to undercut the "unconditional self-legislation" of the "I" (52) that leads to an all-embracing system. So the new rallying cry is not to change the world, but to interpret it continuously. Vattimo and Zabala acknowledge and affirm that this is anarchistic.

Chapter IV explicates the key link between thought and historical conditions, and is thus the Marxist, or communistic, core of the argument. It involves a logic of history based on reciprocal causation. First, the authors claim that the "disarray in thought" that emerged in the twentieth century

could not have happened without the series of social transformations that accompanied, directed, and determined this same disarray. In sum, hermeneutics would not have been possible without the end of Euro centrism (110).

From this side, the argument is that social conditions give rise to specific forms of thought that in turn force "better" forms of thought more adequate to the conditions. But, the causal force goes also in the reverse direction. They remark that "the end of metaphysics was accountable for the wars and violence of the twentieth century" (111), indicating that the disarray of thought, in turn, caused the changed conditions. With this framework of reciprocal causation, the question arises as to whether there is anything exogenous to the reciprocal interconnection of thought and social conditions. If so, the authors would need to specify what that is. If not, we are in an enclosure of idealism.

Actually, Vattimo and Zabala do sanction a kind of idealist reading. They first maintain that a new, though weakened, communism will be based not on the scientific communism of certain Marxists, but will take up the laws of capital -- as independent of the human will -- and properly historicize them. Yet they contend that this process will still serve only as an ideal, whose traits emerge, with some circularity, precisely in the "realization of the ideal" (117). Moreover, they contend that this ideal aspect of hermeneutic communism mirrors the weak messianic ideal of Benjamin (and similarly, as they mention, the desire of Jesus never to have his messianic power fully revealed). In other words, we can bid farewell to the idealism of metaphysics but still maintain the "realization of the ideal" needed for human emancipation.

Vattimo and Zabala do not shy away from using religious thinking to illustrate key points of other parts their theory as well. Hermeneutic communism can be interpreted as a kind of Derridean "to come" (111). Its commitment to justice and solidarity will be similar to Jesus' reference to where "two or three are gathered in my name, there I am in the midst of them." Moreover, communism concerns "love for the other" (112). They go so far as to admit, though not endorse, that a "theological communism" could be legitimate and to remark that the traditions of the Church should not be put aside. But generally they take the view that religion belongs to a prior, though now outdated, epoch in the disclosure of Being's history.

The authors conclude by endorsing the traces of hermeneutic communism embodied in Hugo Chávez's, Luiz Inácio Lula ad Silva Lula's, and Evo Morales's social and political initiatives in South America. All three, in various ways, have worked to decentralize their respective state bureaucracies and return land, dignity, and rights to the weakest segments of the population. They want to promote not "a mere equal distribution of wealth" but a cultural revolution as such (138).

As far as a communist theory goes, Vattimo and Zabala offer some original and provocative modifications, such as their reciprocal-causation and weak-idealism arguments. But their wholesale rejections of metaphysics and a politics of description demand more analysis and argument. For example, they maintain that hermeneutic communism will recover the rights set aside by framed democracies. But what kind of theory of rights can be recouped without reference to fixed descriptions of what they are? Are rights malleable enough to be subject to endless iterability and yet stable enough to be universally extended and applied, sometimes with force? Or do rights operate not on the basis of their content or extension but merely by means of their interpretative reception by the rights holders?

One can also take note of their very selective, and at times inconsistent, use of sources that undergird their argument. Two in particular stand out. First, they make extensive use of Heidegger's ontological hermeneutics while making scant reference to the dire political conclusions he drew from it, particularly in his early works. How can we -- without a thorough and detailed analysis -- endorse an existential view that informed, in any measure, the policies of National Socialism? Secondly, they endorse Martin Luther's sola fide as a kind of precursor of the hermeneutics they endorse. They applaud his claim that the Bible needs no authoritative form of interpretation because it actually interprets itself (81), thus freeing individuals from the hegemonic interpretation of it by religious elites. But where exactly is the human factor in the interpretation? If texts interpret themselves, then how is this linked to the project of privileging the weak? Hermeneutic communism takes on the daunting task of empowering individual persons while relying on a completely impersonal source of meaning and disclosure.

Like any communist theory, hermeneutic communism also needs to confront the question of its own implementation. Will it develop immanently, as a result of the logic of history, or are there still discrete political actions that can and ought to be taken to foster it? They note that hermeneutic communism ought to take on not only the task of interpretation but also of "intensifying the consciousness of conflict" presumably through some sort of government or political intervention (139). Presumably this is being actually carried out by the South American leaders they mention (they even endorse the formation of the Fifth International proposed by Chávez). But who exactly will be responsible for doing this work of implementation? Will it be some individual or some group who has the future vision and thus responsibility for bringing it about, or will it be the result of the unfolding of Being in history? What if the weak are victims of this inevitable intensification of conflict, even if just in the short term?

In conclusion, one cannot but admire and encourage efforts to construct highly theoretic forms of political thought. Vattimo and Zabala have taken up an important tradition -- communism -- and have aimed to follow its spirit and move it in new and creative directions. In so doing, they have described how several contemporary philosophers can inform such a renewal. But in the end they fail to take sufficient account of the vexing problems associated with utilizing a communist logic of history: a logic from which their own hermeneutic reading -- with its causal and idealist assumptions -- is still drawing.