Hermeneutical Heidegger

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Michael Bowler and Ingo Farin (eds.), Hermeneutical Heidegger, Northwestern University Press, 2016, 343pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810132665.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


Hermeneutics has long been recognized as an important element of Heidegger's thought, though scholars interested in hermeneutics have drawn on different parts of his corpus. Being and Time with its account of understanding and the fore-structures is an obvious source, and because Gadamer acknowledged its influence in Truth and Method, it has received considerable attention. In more recent years attention has shifted to the early Freiburg lecture courses, following Theodore Kisiel's claim that Heidegger made his "hermeneutic breakthrough" in the 1919 lecture course, The Idea of Philosophy and the Problem of Worldview.[1] Kisiel's work paved the way for numerous subsequent investigations into the early 'hermeneutics of facticity'. Nevertheless, many questions remain. What relationship does this earlier 'hermeneutics of facticity' bear to the more ontologically oriented hermeneutics of Being and Time? Does Heidegger's notion of the hermeneutical remain consistent throughout his philosophical development, or does it change over time? Does hermeneutics disappear after the turn around 1930? What is the legacy of Heidegger's hermeneutics in the work of a figure like Gadamer?

This volume edited by Michael Bowler and Ingo Farin broaches these and other related questions. It explicitly sets out to address the topics of hermeneutics and philosophical hermeneutics (3). The anthology consists of an introduction and eleven essays contributed by well-established scholars and is organized into four parts. The first part, "Breakthrough to Hermeneutical Philosophy -- History, World, and Self," addresses topics that lead to a hermeneutical philosophy and contains contributions by Thomas Nenon and each of the two editors. The second part, "The Hermeneutical Project of Being and Time," focuses primarily on Heidegger's magnum opus and features essays by Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Thomas Schwartz Wentzer, and Peter E. Gordon. The third part, "Hermeneutics after the Turn: Thinking, Listening, and the Place of Language," deals with Heidegger's hermeneutics in light of the turn, and pushes against the tendency to view hermeneutics as something Heidegger abandons in his later work. This section includes contributions by Jeff Malpas, David Kleinberg-Levin, and Lawrence J. Hatab. The final section, "Heidegger, Gadamer, and Hermeneutical Philosophy," explores new ways of thinking about the relation between the hermeneutics of Heidegger and Gadamer, and consists of essays by Robert J. Dostal and Dennis J. Schmidt. A number of the essays contain some discussion of Heidegger's work of the early 1920s, but the volume does not include a section devoted to the hermeneutics of this period as such, perhaps because it has received so much attention in recent Heidegger scholarship. Although topics such as the hermeneutics of Being and Time and Heidegger's relation to Gadamer have been much discussed over the years, the aim is to trouble received views, resulting in perspectives that are fresh.

Upon reading the volume, I was struck by how varied the senses of 'the hermeneutical' are that operate in the different essays. Nevertheless, there are some common threads that cut across the sections, so in order to highlight the points of convergence and divergence among the essays, I will offer a brief account of the essays grouped according to the dominant sense of 'the hermeneutical' which seems to be emphasized in them. This will require departing in some cases from the order in which they appear in the text.

The first and perhaps most immediately obvious sense of the 'hermeneutical' is interpretation. Though Heidegger's hermeneutics is often characterized as ontology in contrast to a theory of interpretation, this does not mean that hermeneutics in his sense does not relate to interpretation. What makes Heidegger's hermeneutics ontological is that interpretation belongs to Dasein's being. That is, Dasein's being is characterized by understanding, and hence Dasein is always already engaged in interpretation, not only of the world but also of itself. In "Hermeneutics in Being and Time" Dahlstrom takes the point further, arguing that although Heidegger explicitly distances himself from traditional hermeneutics, versions of a number of traditional hermeneutic concepts and theses operate in his account. Among these are the ideas that interpretation is not presuppositionless, that it is not concerned exclusively with linguistic meaning, that it involves a hermeneutic circle, that there can be multiple layers of interpretation that operate on different levels, or indeed on different tracks, and that any interpretation is always incomplete.

In "The Hurdle of Words: Language, Being, and Philosophy in Heidegger" Hatab engages the issue of hermeneutics as interpretation more broadly in order to comment on the task of philosophy as a kind of hermeneutic of life. Deconstruction has argued that philosophical language cannot help but be totalizing because it necessarily betrays the saying for the said. For Hatab, however, if that is the case, then either we need to give up on philosophy or philosophy needs to give up on concepts and propositional language. Against this position, he argues that philosophical claims and concepts should be read as formal indications as Heidegger used this notion in his early work. To use a concept or claim in a formally indicative way is to use it to indicate features of factical life but without any pretense to exhaust or fully comprehend those features. Concepts that are formally indicative "arise out of 'factical life experience' and then point back to tasks of performance" (266).

A second sense of the hermeneutic is suggested by those essays that stress the situatedness of facticity itself, focusing on Dasein's worldly condition and the worldly nature of its understanding. Nenon's essay, "Umwelt in Husserl and Heidegger," takes this worldliness as its theme and sets out to challenge the view that Heidegger's discussion of the world in Being and Time influences the development of Husserl's notion of the lifeworld. He shows that Husserl's concern with the world and sensitivity to the limitations of the theoretical attitude appear much earlier than this story suggests by exploring Husserl's account of the Umwelt in Ideas II and related texts. After comparing that account with Heidegger's, he concludes that their positions are largely compatible and any differences are due to differences in their overall philosophical projects.

Gordon also emphasizes Dasein's worldly nature in "Heidegger, Metaphysics, and the Problem of Self-Knowledge." On his view the hermeneutic thesis has to do with the fact that Dasein is necessarily Being-in-the-world such that its understanding is always and necessarily historically, culturally and socially conditioned. This hermeneutic thesis, he argues, is at odds with the notion of authenticity in Being and Time. Authenticity reflects a norm of self-transparency according to which a sort of redemption is achieved through self-understanding (182), and this norm has its roots in metaphysics. The condition of situatedness that marks the hermeneutic thesis is at odds with the metaphysical residue of the norm of self-transparency involved in authenticity.

The essays that emphasize history and the historical exemplify a third sense of the hermeneutic, which extends the idea of worldly situatedness by developing its temporal and historical dimensions. Farin's "Different Notions of History in Heidegger's Work" identifies three phases to Heidegger's thinking about history. First is the examination of the historicity of factical life in the early 1920s which establishes the historical as defining reality (34). The second phase in the mid-1920s connects historicity with fundamental ontology. In the third phase from the 1930s onwards Heidegger focuses on the history of being. Farin expresses a suspicion of the ontological notion of history from the second phase and claims that Heidegger overcomes it by rejecting the onto-theological understanding of the ontological difference (54).

Like Nenon's essay, Bowler's "Heidegger and the Hermeneutic Understanding of Human Being" emphasizes a contrast with Husserl but this time focuses on the concept of the subject involved in Husserl's and Heidegger's respective accounts and what each implies about the place of history. Bowler argues that ultimately for Husserl the subject is the pure ego, which is not a historical being because it "constitutes historical reality, but it is not itself historical in any direct sense" (98). On his telling, then, Husserl's subject stands outside of historical reality to constitute it, while Heidegger's subject (Dasein) constitutes historical reality through a movement of historizing in which historical being is given as something it possesses and has at its disposal. Thus, Dasein is hermeneutic because of the historizing that is involved in its self-understanding.

In "Heidegger and Hegel: Exploring the Hidden Hegelianism of Being and Time" Schwartz Wentzer picks up similar themes in arguing that Heidegger's hermeneutics of facticity is motivated by a revision of Hegelianism. He suggests that there is a parallel between the development of spirit in Hegel and Heidegger's view that philosophy arises in factical life as an understanding or interpretation of that factical life. In both cases, the insight is drawn from the claim that self-consciousness occurs in and through the development of history. Self-understanding not only occurs in history but takes a historical form. Thus, interpretation is subject to historical determination, and Dasein's self-understanding is always historically articulated. Schwartz Wentzer argues that Heidegger modifies Hegel by exchanging the Hegelian logic of a teleological dialectics for the method of hermeneutic destruction and the principle of subjectivity for the concept of facticity (144).

A fourth and perhaps the most controversial sense of the hermeneutic is brought out by those essays that argue for the claim that, contrary to the received view, the hermeneutical does not disappear after the turn but instead shifts to refer to the disclosure or event of being in language. This makes hermeneutics a matter of truth. In "The Beckoning of Language: Heidegger's Hermeneutic Transformation of Thinking" Malpas argues that Heidegger develops the relation between ontology and hermeneutics in a way that transforms both and ultimately results in a topology. He shows, first, that the hermeneutics of facticity is not just an interpretation of facticity but expresses the idea that interpreting belongs to facticity and that all interpreting is factical. In this regard he emphasizes a point also made by Schwartz, Wentzer, and Bowler. However, he then argues that the notion of the hermeneutical shifts in "A Dialogue on Language" to refer to the self-showing character of being or the presencing of what is present (210). This marks, according to Malpas, a move away from thinking the hermeneutical as interpretation, as least in the usual sense, toward the idea of awareness and orientation (211). Thus, hermeneutics is about the disclosing, presencing or clearing itself. Language creates the clearing where being presences, and since the clearing is the site or place of emergence, ontology becomes topology.

Kleinberg-Levin similarly finds the hermeneutic in language and the event of being. In "Abyssal Tonalities: Heidegger's Language of Hearkening," he locates the hermeneutical moment in the notion of listening, specifically a kind of hearing or hearkening to the saying of meaning and being that is covered over by technological society. This hermeneutic hearkening can awaken us out of the ontological forgetfulness brought on by the univocity of the levelled down language of the Gestell, and it relates to truth insofar as it is an attunement to the event of being (231).

Which of these senses of the hermeneutic are at work in the two essays on the relation between Heidegger and Gadamer? Dostal implicitly agrees with Malpas and Kleinberg-Levin that there is something hermeneutical to be found in Heidegger's later work insofar as he asks in "Heidegger's Hermeneutics, Gadamer's Hermeneutics" what we are to make of Gadamer's claim that he is influenced by Heidegger's later work and aims to make it more accessible. This is a puzzle since Heidegger himself claims to have left hermeneutics behind in the later work. The key, Dostal argues, lies in their respective treatments of language. Both oppose instrumentalist and representationalist accounts of language because they are rooted in a subjectivism that should be rejected although Gadamer resists the anti-humanism to which Heidegger's subjectivism leads him.

In "Heidegger and Gadamer on Hermeneutics and the Difficulty of Truth" Schmidt is primarily interested in highlighting the differences between Heidegger and Gadamer, but also points out the differences between Heidegger's thinking of the hermeneutic in different periods. He notes that in the texts of the early 1920s, Heidegger's hermeneutics consists in an interpretation of facticity in which facticity is brought under concepts. But by the time of Being and Time, it has become tied to the problem of understanding, which is concerned with the problem of the disclosure of the world and thus of truth (304-5). Schmidt argues that Gadamer carries this project forward through his treatment of aesthetic experience even as Heidegger turns away from it. Schmidt likens the work of art to Heidegger's formal indications, maintaining that the disclosure of truth that occurs in aesthetic experience formally indicates the movement of life in a manner that preserves its singularity. Schmidt argues that this experience of life is not only aesthetic, but also constitutes us as ethical beings. Hence, the notion of understanding that one finds in Gadamer's hermeneutics displays a sensitivity to ethical significance that is absent in Heidegger's hermeneutics (316). In invoking the notion of formal indication, Schmidt brings us back to the idea of a hermeneutics of facticity but now one that is enacted in a different register, namely through art.

Though all the essays engage with the topic of Heidegger and the hermeneutic, a diversity of approaches to the topic is clearly possible, as well as a plurality of understandings of the hermeneutical itself. The editors acknowledge this multiplicity in their introduction and embrace it as a healthy indication of 'questioning of basic concepts' (3), and indeed the diversity enriches the overall collection. But in view of the plurality of senses of the hermeneutical at play, the introduction might have been more effective at introducing the overarching philosophical concerns it aims to address, motivating the project, and providing a sense for the whole. Nevertheless, the diversity of views makes for interesting reading. Many of the essays are of high quality and advance the discourse on the topic. This book should interest anyone concerned with hermeneutics generally and hermeneutics in Heidegger specifically.

[1] Theodore Kisiel, The Genesis of Heidegger's 'Being and Time' (University of California Press, 1993).