Hermeneutics and Phenomenology: Figures and Themes

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Saulius Geniusas and Paul Fairfield (eds.), Hermeneutics and Phenomenology: Figures and Themes, Bloomsbury, 2018, 238pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350078024.

Reviewed by Frank Schalow, University of New Orleans


This collection of essays, edited by Saulius Geniusas and Paul Fairfield, provides a retrospective glance at the philosophical methodology whose development would transform the landscape of 20th century continental thought. In their introduction, the editors pose an important and provocative question as to the connection between hermeneutics and phenomenology, indeed, how the two philosophical approaches within the tradition of Continental philosophy intersect, and, perhaps at certain junctures, also diverge. "While much of the landscape of twentieth-century continental philosophy is shaped by phenomenology and hermeneutics, the relation between them remains puzzling" (1). Yet, it is equally case that the precise synergies and differences between the two methodologies have been increasingly taken for granted with the subsequent evolution of Continental philosophy in the twentieth-first century, that is, from its early German roots in the philosophies of Edmund Husserl, Max Scheler, and Martin Heidegger. The editors summarize the key thrust of their project in this way:

Questions regarding the relation between hermeneutics and phenomenology are of central significance for contemporary philosophy in general and continental philosophy in particular . . . How one conceives the relation will depend on what one understands to be the meaning of the relational terms as well as where one is situated in either or both of these traditions. A multi-perspectival volume on hermeneutics and phenomenology -- one that illuminates how the relation is viewed from both hermeneutical and phenomenological standpoints -- is thus much needed. Only on the basis of such a re-evaluation can one further reassess the significance of both traditions for contemporary philosophy. (2)

To provide a road map for this "re-evaluation," they divide the volume into three parts, comprised of fourteen essays. The first part includes essays on the origins of phenomenology and hermeneutics in the 19th century, focusing on the contributions of G.W.F. Hegel and Wilhelm Dilthey. Both Part II and Part III are more extensive, incorporating several essays addressing the complementary angles of "Phenomenology in Dialogue with Hermeneutics" and "Hermeneutics in Dialogue with Phenomenology," respectively. To this end, the editors draw upon a diverse range of topics written by a contingent of internationally recognized scholars, including Jean Grondin, Dermot Moran, and Lawrence K. Schmidt. The attempt to organize and present the themes of this volume houses a self-referential problem. Specifically, the task undertaken therein is already an interpretation, that is, harboring its own set of presuppositions (Voraussetzungen), thereby borrowing from and implicating the insights of the hermeneutical method. The essays are themselves "interpretations" in the broadest sense, and are in their formulation and practice implicitly owing to hermeneutics. The self-reflexivity that is implied in this overall project, however, does not undermine its importance, as much as provides impetus for further questioning. After all, one of the primary insights of hermeneutics, going back to Heidegger, is that is necessary to begin somewhere, to provide a point of departure from which to proceed. What is crucial, on the other hand, is acknowledging these presuppositions.

To offer a historical perspective, Heidegger was the first philosopher of the twentieth-century to establish the link between phenomenology and hermeneutics. As an assistant to the phenomenologist, Husserl, the "youthful" Heidegger also immersed himself in Dilthey's hermeneutical writings, only to discover that the interpretation is grounded in the fundamental ontological structure of what it means to be human as Da-sein. This insight was the first step in a "breakthrough" by which Heidegger would forge a new philosophical method by combining phenomenology with hermeneutics; he embarked upon an original pathway (Denkweg) via a "hermeneutic phenomenology," in contrast to his mentor Husserl's brand of transcendental phenomenology.

In seizing upon the question of being as the foremost philosophical concern, Heidegger presented an innovative view of what for Husserl initially constituted the phenomenon or the "thing itself." If the phenomenon coincides with being (das Sein), and, to paraphrase Heraclitus's characterization of physis, "loves to hide," then what pervades the manner of the self-manifestation of the phenomenon is precisely the opposite, namely, that it does not show itself but rather withdraws into concealment. If the phenomenon has this inherently elusive character, it cannot be approached "head on" or straightforwardly, but rather can only be addressed by proceeding along a circuitous path. Enter hermeneutics. In retrospect, Heidegger devises a strategy that can address the elusive character of the phenomenon, which can attend to and reconcile with this tendency toward concealment, in order that its opposite or unconcealment can prevail. Hermeneutics then becomes the entryway into phenomenology, which can transform the latter by introducing de-construction as the strategy to confront the concealment of the phenomenon, i.e., in order to expand the circle of inquiry so that being can be brought to self-manifestation. Rather than proceed in a linear way, phenomenology, through the direction of hermeneutics, addresses the phenomenon along an elliptical path, which must "question-back" to the origins as the prerequisite for proceeding forward, and thereby retrace its presuppositions in order to broaden the horizon of what is understandable and can be philosophically understood.

As the key to his "breakthrough," Heidegger recognized that phenomenology must become hermeneutical, if it is to address the topic of being in a concrete manner. Perhaps in hindsight he did not emphasize as strongly the flipside, namely, that to become philosophical, hermeneutics requires phenomenology, in order that its interpretive strategies do not become free-floating, merely literary and textual inventions divorced from human experience (and "ek-sistence" as well). Even in the case of his Biblical hermeneutics, Rudolf Bultmann, Heidegger's colleague at Marburg, recognized that the self-understanding of the believer in his/her concrete existence is required in order to demythologize Christianity.

Hermeneutics guides the shift in phenomenology as a presuppositionless science in Husserl's sense to an enterprise that is immersed in and seeks to reclaim its presuppositions. Certainly, within the 19th century, Dilthey paves the way for the development of hermeneutics, as Hegel first did for phenomenology, by introducing that term into the philosophical lexicon as endemic to his dialectical method. In "Dilthey's Path," Jean-Claude Gens outlines the historical background from which Dilthey developed hermeneutics as the key to grounding the human sciences. "The demand to ground the human sciences in this original experience plainly brings Dilthey back into proximity not as much with Humboldt as with Schleiermacher's thesis, according to which it is 'feeling,'" which provides access to the 'immediacy' of human experience. (28). Understanding as Verstehen is predicated anew upon such experience, which adds a new level of concreteness from which the meanings relevant to our humanity can be developed, pre-understood, and interpreted.

In "Phenomenology and the Givenness of the Hermeneutical Circle," James Mensch addresses this development in three major figures of continental philosophy: Heidegger, Gadamer, and Ricoeur. Following Dilthey's lead, Heidegger recognized originally that understanding (Verstehen) requires presuppositions. But understanding always precedes from what is pre-understood, entailing a set of presuppositions, which must be unraveled in the process of rendering that which is understandable, that is, in an act of interpretation. The "back and forth" movement of understanding, which for Heidegger is grounded in ecstatic temporality, proceeds along a circular path, giving rise to the hermeneutical "circle." According to Mensch, the existential, ontological grounding of human understanding defines only one aspect of this circularity. Heidegger's student, Hans-Georg Gadamer, appeals to the 19th century thinker, Friedrich Schleiremacher, in order to resurrect the importance of the "relation of part to whole" to define the trajectory of human understanding (69). This relation becomes explicit through the reciprocal process in which the interpreter and his/her tradition become mutually determining, thereby situating understanding within its pre-given, historical-cultural horizon. The circle of understanding thereby extends to the relation between the Western tradition and the interpreter, thereby separating interpretation and history from their exclusive dependence on their ontological origins. "Implicit in the above is a radical historization of our understanding of texts" (69).

Gadamer's reaffirmation of hermeneutics as focused on texts takes another turn in Paul Ricoeur's attempt to mediate "conflicting" interpretations, which occur across multiple fields of science and literature, theology and psychoanalysis. Appealing to such thinkers as Marx, Nietzsche, and Freud, Ricouer identifies a "hermeneutics of suspicion," which is inherently self-critical. The self-critical character of interpretation honors truth, not by trying to monopolize it on ontological grounds, but by allowing for a "plurality" of interpretations that must always be open to revision (71). Ricoeur reaffirms Heidegger only to the extent that ontology still requires hermeneutics, that is, insofar as the emphasis is always on the "meaning of being" (Sinn von Sein), rather than on being as an ideational concept (71).

Despite the German roots of both phenomenology and hermeneutics (as well as their marriage), we must also acknowledge the evolution that occurs in such French thinkers as Merleau-Ponty, as well as Ricoeur. John Arthos addresses this development in his essay, "Ricouer's Unrecognized Debt to Merleau-Ponty." On the surface, Ricoeur's diversification of hermeneutics on different fronts seems to bypass the phenomenological focus of the problem of embodiment that defines Merleau-Ponty's thought. Yet, as Arthos argues, Ricoeur's emphasis on "meaning" and its inscriptions in various discourse, e.g., from theology to psychoanalysis, must still be anchored in the pulse of emotion, feeling, and exposure of the "flesh" that characterizes the overall pathos of human condition. This connection becomes evident as far back as Ricoeur's famous declaration in Fallible Man that the human being "is the joy of the 'yes' in the sadness of the finite." As Arthos states: "Then there is the shared attitude that I have called pathos. . . . Between action and passion, production and reception, we are creatures of the in-between, shuttling back and forth endlessly" (119).

In "The Hermeneutical Turn of Phenomenology in the Young Heidegger's Thought," Sophie-Jan Arrien identifies the germ of a new methodology through Heidegger's development of formal indication. Heidegger's breakthrough hinges on recognizing that "meaning" cannot simply be conceptualized through theoretically derived categories, but must instead originate through the enactment of lived experience, specifically, the significations that accrue to the temporal, lived-through enactment of human facticity. Arrien summarizes the evolution of Heidegger's hermeneutics in this way:

The significances (Bedeutsamkeiten) of life are lived; they express themselves and are always apprehended in this life. From a phenomenological-hermeneutical standpoint, this immersion of worldly significances in the primordial mobility of life, which they necessarily express, precludes the possibility of 'freeze-framing' this or that lived experience of meaning. Thus, grasping them cannot result from a pure eidetic intuition, from a pure vision. It rather necessitates a comprehensive intuition, or, more precisely a hermeneutical intuition. (145-146)

Formal indication then becomes possible as a way to employ the example of individual experiences to implicate universal, ontological structures. Specifically, the lived instance of the individual's facticity implicates care (Sorge) as the being of human existence, along with the grounding of its "meaning" in temporality, and, reciprocally, the self-questioning of what it means "to be" grants the inquirer access to the phenomenon, i.e., being (Sein), to what shows itself, via his/her factic life experience.

In the penultimate essay, "Traces of Endings: The Time of Last Things," Felix Ó Murchadha asks the question as to the "meaning" that the concern for the "eschaton" can have in a secular world, which for the most part discounts the possibility of a transcendent presence impinging itself within the temporal realm. This is a major problem for any phenomenology of religion, which seeks to establish an experiential basis in order to render meaningful the manifestation of the Divine to the human. Any promise of ultimate fulfillment, under the auspices of what Immanuel Kant called "hope," seems to imply a linear vision of a perfection that can only be idealized but never given. Murchadha argues that the hermeneutical detour around this predicament lies in outlining the temporal modality of a dispositional shift, which allows the ecstatic moment to serve as a proxy for an eschatological transformation. This dispositional shift is the human capacity to be awakened to and overtaken by the power of love, thereby "catching up," as it were, to the entirety that time has to offer in an instantaneous flash. Through the facticity of the believer, a rift occurs in this linear progression of time, breaking open a nexus between finitude and eternity. "Events of ending are momentary, reflected in the instantaneous change of the affective shift of disposition toward the world as such" (186). As insightful as this account may be, more could be unpacked, as to how a hermeneutic, phenomenological vision of the eschaton can successfully transform the metaphysically-based grammar of traditional religious discourse.

Geniusas and Fairfield have assembled an exceptional collection that frames a key problem about the relation between hermeneutics and phenomenology, and reopens this topic on multiple fronts. Indeed, I have the highest praise for this volume. Its contribution could, perhaps, never have been more timely than today.