Hermeneutics and Reflection: Heidegger and Husserl on the Concept of Phenomenology

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Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann, Hermeneutics and Reflection: Heidegger and Husserl on the Concept of Phenomenology, Kenneth Maly (tr.), Toronto University Press, 2013. xxx + 152pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442640092.

Reviewed by Thomas Nenon, University of Memphis


This book consists of three essays in which the author presents Heidegger's "hermeneutic phenomenology" (in contrast to what he calls Husserl's "reflective phenomenology"), as developed in two early lecture courses that have now been published as Volumes 56/56[1] and 17[2] of the Gesamtausgabe and in §7 of Being and Time[3]. The first, by far the longest, essay is a reading of the 1919 lecture course; the second relies on the 1923/24 lectures; the third is an interpretation and commentary on the Heidegger's well-known description of phenomenology in the "Introduction" to BT.

In each of these essays, the guiding theme is the contrast between Heidegger's phenomenology, which is an enactment of lived experience itself as "the a- and pre-theoretical domain, which keeps itself closed off when we are theoretically oriented" (13), and Husserl's phenomenology. It recounts how Heidegger's hermeneutic phenomenology takes as its starting point the concrete involvement of what will come to be called Dasein in the world as a significant whole in contrast to what von Hermann calls reflective phenomenology, which he describes as still trapped within the prejudices of traditional modern philosophy that is oriented primarily toward theory, which culminates in scientific knowledge and hence focuses primarily on perception as opposed to the fullness of engaged practical life. Heidegger's hermeneutic phenomenology is introduced in each of the essays by way of contrast to Husserl's reflective phenomenology with a slightly different emphasis in each of them, while they all at the same time follow Heidegger in acknowledging the key role that Husserl's phenomenology played for Heidegger in the development of his own positions.

In the early 1919 lectures, as laid out in the first essay, such hermeneutical phenomenology is described as a form of "understanding looking" (21) that is fundamentally different from "theoretical knowing, whose known is only things, what is reified, or what is ob-jectified" (21), including consciousness itself as an object of reflection. What makes Heidegger's phenomenology hermeneutic is the fact that "Understanding looking accompanies the sense of enactment of living-experience and is thereby capable of interpreting the pre-theoretical essence that is own to lived-experience" (22). It is attuned to the things with which we concern ourselves as they present themselves to us against the backdrop of lived experience that is the most basic or original "event" or "Ereignis" from which hermeneutic phenomenology proceeds.

The contrast is then drawn to Husserlian reflective phenomenology that (a) remains oriented on theory and thereby misses the crucial practical dimensions of lived experience (20, 67), so that it (b) assumes that the primary access to the things around us is perception upon which all of the other ways in which we encounter things are founded (32-33, 36, 50), and (c) is enacted by a "pure ego pole" that "ob-jectifies" instead of living in the acts of lived experience as consciousness (30, 51). The positive example of such a lived experience that von Herrmann uses is Heidegger's description of the lectern that I recognize as such immediately upon entering the classroom. I do not see first of all a brown object of a certain size and shape and then later, in a subsequent act, add a layer or practical relevance to it, which is what he says Husserl's phenomenology would suggest, but rather, in lived experience, I recognize it immediately and from the outset as the lectern, a recognition that it is not founded upon some previous and independent act of (theoretical) perception, but rather precedes any subsequent abstractive focus on its physical properties as presented in perception.

The second essay contrasts Heidegger's notion of phenomenology as one that takes a different path than Husserl's phenomenology does in his middle period where it "has de facto become descriptive, eidetic science of transcendentally pure consciousness" (91). Husserl's phenomenology, von Herrmann says, with reference to a quote from Heidegger's text, is guided, "by the predominance of an empty and thereby fantastical idea of certainty and evidence" (93). The basic issue, according to Heidegger, is not something specific to Husserl but to Western philosophy in general, going back not just to Descartes, but to Aristotle, namely whether the starting point for investigations into being should be oriented primarily on beings that do not have the character of the "possibility of Dasein for a human life" (GA 17, 42) or Dasein itself. This anticipates, of course, Heidegger's claim later in BT that the history of philosophy is characterized by a kind of self-forgottenness of Being due above all to the mistaken starting point in the search for the structure of being in terms of categories that apply specifically to things that Dasein is not. He proposes instead that phenomenology should begin with the experience of our own existence and derive the structures of that existence, existentials, from it in order to see how Dasein's understanding of the kinds of beings that it is not depends above all on its own self-understanding and how the fundamental structures of those kinds of beings must rather be explicated in terms of temporality as Dasein's most fundamental possibility.

 In fact, von Herrmann himself points out that Hussserl's Logical Investigations represent more a breakthrough than a simple continuation of the unquestioned orientation on certainty and evidence as pursued by the tradition (94). Husserl's contribution was to address very directly and refute naturalistic tendencies in interpreting consciousness, for instance in his well-known essay "Philosophy as a Rigorous Science" from 1911, but Heidegger finds Hussserl's refutation of historicism in the same essay lacking. Von Hermann cites Heidegger's observation that, because of Husserl's preoccupation with securing valid knowledge, "human Dasein as such is excluded from the possibility of being encountered" (97). By contrast, hermeneutic phenomenology, as what Heidegger in 1919 had called "the pre-theoretical primordial science of living and living-experience" and in the 1923/24 lectures is now called "the scientific origin of factical life, ontological phenomenology, and hermeneutic of facticity" (101), is directed squarely to human life and its concerns as such in its very historical being. Von Herrmann follows Heidegger in acknowledging the crucial role and positive role that Husserl has played in opening up the possibilities of phenomenology as Heidegger pursues them, but in this brief essay von Herrmann still associates Husserl more with the tradition than with the new direction Heidegger is taking. Particularly with regard to this essay, in order to show just how much Heidegger's emphasis is on the continuities instead of the differences, it would have been helpful to quote Heidegger's unequivocal statement that what is called "reflection" in Husserl is far different from what Descartes or others in modern philosophy mean by it: Heidegger notes that,

One must pay attention to what reflection is about: about consciousness with the fundamental character of intentionality. Reflection is not about psychic [i.e., mental, TN] events but rather about ways of relating to the objective world. It is therefore a fundamental confusion to characterize Husserlian phenomenology as a transcendental psychology, as Scheler does . . . . Phenomenology is directed not to acts in the old sense, but to new domains, to the way one relates oneself to things so that that to which the self-relating is directed is present in it (GA 17, 262).

Moreover, this "way of relating oneself to things" is nothing other than what Heidegger will call "comportment" in BT.

 What Heidegger does object to, but does not emphasize in his recognition of Husserl as opening up phenomenology as a possibility, is the way Husserl intends to develops it as a "science of reason," (GA 17, 263) that still preserves too much of the legacy of the scientific orientation on evidence, even for the most basic kinds of truths, like "the truths of religion or art," where truth is something much more basic than adequacy (GA 17, 98). Von Herrmann alludes to this point when he notes that, even in Husserl's final work on the Crisis of European Sciences,[4] Husserl still reserved a special place for human beings as rational agents (102).

Most of the third essay follows Heidegger's own lead in §7 of BT in describing the continuities as much as the differences between their approaches to phenomenology, while at the same time emphasizing just how significant those differences are. Heidegger follows Husserl much of the way in his explanation of the nature of phenomenology as a philosophical method. Where they depart, as von Herrmann recounts it, is in Husserl's determination of phenomenology not only as a method, but also as related above all to a specific topic. Von Herrmann describes Husserlian phenomenological philosophy as an analysis "at first . . . of lived-experiences of pure consciousness, then phenomenology of lived-experience of transcendental consciousness, namely, transcendental subjectivity" (110). Heidegger, he says, accepts Husserl's formal conception of philosophy as a method but differs in two main ways. The first is related to what von Herrmann sees as the consequences of Husserl's conception of subjectivity. It is not something that Heidegger says directly, but von Herrmann reads Heidegger's emphasis upon allowing the things to show themselves as they are in themselves as a rebuke of what von Herrmann has referred to in the first two essays as Husserl's failure to overcome the modern assumptions associated with science as a theoretical enterprise. Von Herrmann states, "The thematic object of Husserlian phenomenology is the life of consciousness with its lived-experiences, namely acts, and with that which in the acts of consciousness are given objectively in consciousness" (125), and he reminds the reader that,

According to his basic approach, Husserl comprehends the pre- and outside-scientific ways of access as those which he in summary calls simple sense experience (also life-world experience): the present-related and making present perception and its presentiating modifications of the present-related memory of the present, the past-related recollection, and the future-related anticipation (expectation). In contrast, Heidegger, on the basis of his Dasein-approach, calls for, as pre-scientific ways of access, that which he designates terminologically as comportments of circumspect caring-for -- of the caring dealing with beings near which we always reside. (117)

The second main difference is closely related and is one that Heidegger is himself very explicit about in §7. It concerns not the method but the appropriate subject-matter for phenomenology. Von Herrmann describes it as Dasein in "its existential constitution of being and of the self-related-ecstatic-horizonal disclosure of being in general" (135), even though these are not the words Heidegger uses in this section yet, since these are terms that will be subsequently introduced only in the course of the work itself. What Heidegger in this early section does say is that the proper topic of phenomenology is precisely that which for the most part does not show itself and is most properly in need of elucidation, namely not beings but the Being of beings (SZ 35) that for the most part remains concealed. As we have noted above in our discussion of von Herrmann's second essay, Heidegger comes to the view early on that the kind of Being that, for the most part and precisely, we do not face is our own Being, that of Dasein, and the project of BT is to show how Dasein's Being is above all and most basically a form of self-relation that is normally concealed to us but is at the same time the ground of how everything -- we ourselves and the beings within the world that we are not -- shows up for us.

In this essay, von Herrmann refers to these structures more than he explains them, and he assumes that the reader is familiar with at least the basic outlines of the analyses that Heidegger presents in BT just as the other two chapters focus more on presenting differences between Husserl and Heidegger than on explaining to the uninitiated what the various terms mean that Heidegger introduces along the way as he attempts to avoid pitfalls associated with standard philosophical terms like "objectivity," "subjects," "knowledge," and "consciousness," with which most philosophical readers are more familiar. So, although these studies will be clear to scholars already steeped in Hussserlian and Heideggerian terminology and familiar with their basic positions, they do not serve as ready introductions to the texts and topics they discuss. Other books by this author that the translator cites in his introduction serve that purpose much better.

There is no doubt that von Herrmann is one of the world's most knowledgeable scholars and careful and sympathetic readers of Heidegger. I should also note that I learned much from his thoughtful readings of Heidegger, Fichte, and Kant in many seminars he held in Freiburg that I had the privilege of attending. Hence it is no surprise that his presentations of Heidegger's project and the steps along the way in its development as traced out in these essays are accurate and compelling. However, his readings of Husserl are a little less charitable than Heidegger's own statements about Husserl in the texts that von Herrmann interprets in this book. I use the term "charitable" advisedly because the nature of Husserl's work lends itself to so many different interpretations. Husserl's work is pivotal not just in the sense that it had a great impact on so many subsequent thinkers in twentieth century philosophy, including perhaps most notably Heidegger, and because his starting point was traditional in just the ways that von Herrmann outlines, but it is also pivotal in the sense that there are important turning points within his thinking as he constantly expands the range of the topics his phenomenology addresses and introduces new distinctions and refinements along the way that end up taking him in a very different direction than the tradition he began with. Heidegger himself was well aware of this. So, for instance, it is true that Husserl in the Logical Investigations presents his work as exercises in the grounding of science, and the model is clearly the natural sciences. Throughout his early work, he continues to present phenomenology as the philosophical basis for an Erkenntnistheorie, an epistemology or theory of knowledge whereby the kind of knowledge that is meant here is theoretical knowledge and the most powerful example of it is the kind of knowledge produced in modern natural sciences. The most common examples of knowledge he presents not just in his early works but throughout his career are descriptions of perceptions of physical objects ("Dinge" or "things," as he calls them). So when von Herrmann points to Husserl's phenomenology as still in the sway of modern philosophical assumptions about knowledge, perception, and objectivity, he has more than enough passages in Husserl's works to which he can point. Moreover, even in his latest work, Husserl retains the traditional language of subjectivity, consciousness, and reflection that at the very least bring with them the connotations and assumptions from the history of modern philosophy that Husserl himself often finds himself struggling to work against. Heidegger from the very outset has decided to avoid these terms and attempt to come up with new ones that better fit the phenomena as he sees them.

On the other hand, though, Husserl's phenomenological investigations took him in directions fundamentally different from those of modern natural science as he began to take seriously some of Dilthey's insights into the differences between the natural and the spiritual (geistige) worlds. By the time Husserl was composing the manuscripts that would be published only after his death as the Ideas II,[5] he had come to see that in the attitude in which we live our daily lives, the "personalistic attitude," the things we encounter within the "surrounding world (Umwelt)" are encountered not primarily in terms of their bare perceptual properties, but rather in terms of their relevance, their uses and values to us. The surrounding world of our daily lives is a world in which a person is not primarily interested in theoretical knowledge for its own sake, but rather

conducts himself as an acting human being in practical life, makes use of the objects of his Umwelt, shapes them to his purposes, and thereby evaluates them according to aesthetic, ethical, utilitarian viewpoints, or in which he engages in a communicative relationship to his fellow human beings, talks to them, writes letters to them, reads about them in the newspaper, associates with them in common acts, makes promises to them, etc. (Ideas II, 181-2)

It contains

not mere things (Dinge), but use-objects (clothes, household utensils, weapons, tools), works of art, literary products, items used in religious or legal actions (seals, official necklaces, coronation insignia, ecclesiastic symbols etc.); and it contains not only individual persons: the persons are rather members of communities, of higher-order personal unities that lead their lives as a whole, maintain themselves as individuals, continually enter or leave the communities across time, which have their own communal characteristics, ethical and legal orders, their own ways of functioning, their dependencies on circumstances, orderly patterns of change, their ways of developing or remaining constant over time depending on the circumstances. (Ideas II, 182)

One could easily include lecterns here as well.

Hence the differences between Husserl's phenomenology in the Ideas II and Heidegger's descriptions of our encounters with things around us in lived experience are at this stage not nearly as great as the first essay would suggest, and since Heidegger had access to the manuscripts on which the subsequent publication was based, he knew this. This is perhaps why Heidegger himself refers to Natorp, Rickert, and Windelband much more often and critically than to Husserl in these lectures. He does say that Husserl would describe the experience of the lectern any differently than he does.

 In the Ideas II, Husserl still does employ the notion of Fundierung and says that cultural objects like lecterns and tools and that persons are founded upon physical aspects of those objects. However, this does not mean that we encounter them first independently in terms of their perceptible properties and only subsequently recognize them as tools or people, but rather that we must see something with some specific shapes and sizes consistent with being a hammer or being a human being if we are going to recognize them as tools or as persons, but not that what it is to be a tool or a person is in any way reducible to the physical properties of those things. The perceptible properties are strata, moments, non-independent components of the experienced things that are nonetheless an essential part of experiencing them, even if we never experience them on their own except through abstraction.

Husserl is also very clear that the process of "naturalizing" objects, "objectifying" them in the sense of modern science is just such an "abstraction" (Ideas II, 25) from the concrete experience of a thing that includes, instead of excluding, their practical and aesthetic characters prior to this abstractive process. In this sense, the naturalistic attitude is not our natural attitude, but rather an abstraction from it. This is also consistent with fundamental themes from Heidegger's work. Why then does Heidegger, especially in the 1923/24 lecture, continue to criticize Husserl's over-reliance on perception as a model for our comportment not just in the theoretical sphere, but in the axiological and practical spheres as well?

I do not think it is because he believes that Husserl holds the view that the only genuine properties of things are their physical, perceptible properties. I also do not think it is because he believes that Husserl does not recognize the priority of the practical and evaluative aspects of experience in our daily lives. Rather, I think the answer is that Husserl continues to use the model of intention and fulfillment/disappointment through intuitions according to the model of perceptual experience in his grounding of values and goods. Husserl's relatively recently published lectures on ethics from 1920 and 1924[6] -- precisely the period in which Heidegger was holding his own lecture courses in Freiburg as well -- make this point very explicitly. So when Heidegger recognizes that Husserl's conception of evidence "is vastly superior to everything else that has ever been said about it" (GA 17, 272) and acknowledges that Husserl sees that each domain of objects, including values and goods, has a specific evidence corresponding to its content (GA 17, 273), he still thinks that there is a problem because Husserl's orientation on confirmation and facts about these kinds of issues along the lines of the perceptual model misses "understanding life itself in its authentic Being and responding to the question concerning the character of its Being" (GA 17, 274-75), not as a series of position-takings to be confirmed or disconfirmed through intuitions, as Husserl would have it, but as a project a self-relation in which Dasein projects itself in a way that facts-of-the-matter cannot ground, as a being with Existenz as its basic form of Being. This is a genuine difference between Heidegger and Husserl,[7] and I think that this is the real point that Heidegger is aiming at both in the 1923/24 lecture and in §7 of BT.

In sum, then, I think that von Herrmann is correct in the way he outlines how Heidegger is attempting to chart out an entirely new course for phenomenology that is indeed different from Husserl's, even on the most charitable reading of Husserl, and that the contrast between Heidegger's phenomenology and many of the most basic assumptions of modern philosophy is indeed as stark as von Herrmann portrays it. However, I also think that Husserl's phenomenology in many ways in his middle and later periods was also well on the way to overcoming some of these assumptions on its own, and that Heidegger was able to recognize this in spite of what he maintained were nonetheless crucial limitations that Husserl himself was ultimately never able to overcome.

[1] Martin Heidegger, Zur Bestimmung der Philosophie: Frühe Freiburger Vorlesungen, Kriegsnotsemester 1919 und Sommersemester 1919, in Gesamtausgabe, Volume 56/57, ed. Bernd Heimbüchel. Klostermann: Frankfurt am Main, 1987. References to the Gesamtausgabe will be cited as GA followed by the volume, then the page number.

[2] Martin Heidegger, Einführung in die phänomenologische Forschung: Marburger Vorlesung, Wintersemester 1923/24 in Gesamtausgabe, Volume 17, ed. by Friedrich Wilhelm von Hermann. Klostermann: Frankfurt am Main, 1994.

[3] Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit. Niemeyer: Tübingen, 1972. The page numbers of this and subsequent editions of this work are included in the margins of the translation of this work into English as Being and Time and in its publication as Volume 2 of the Gesamtausgabe, so this work will be cited as BT followed by the page number.

[4] Edmund Husserl, Die Krisis der europäischen Wissenschaften und die transzendentale Phänomenologie, Husserliana, Band VI (den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff 1962). Translated by David Carr as The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology (Northwestern University Press: Evanston, 1954).

[5] Edmund Husserl, Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophy. Zweites Buch. Husserliana, Band IV (den Haag: Nijhoff 1952). Translated by R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer as Ideas pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy, Book II (Kluwer: Dordrecht, 1991). Citations will follow the page numbers of the German edition, which are listed in the margins of the English translation.

[6] Edmund Husserl, Einleitung in die Ethik, Vorlesungen Sommersemester 1920/1925, Husserliana Volume XXXVII, edited by Henning Peucker. Dordrecht: Kluwer 2004.

[7] For a fuller treatment of this point, see: Thomas Nenon, "Martin Heidegger and the Grounding of Ethics," in: Lester Embree and Thomas Nenon (eds.), Husserl's Ideen. (Dordrecht: Springer, 2013), pp. 176-193.