Hermeneutics: Writings and Lectures

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Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics: Writings and Lectures, David Pellauer (tr.), Polity, 2013, 185 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745661223.

Reviewed by Scott Davidson, Oklahoma City University


The first thing to note about this book is that, though it bears his name, it was never published or prepared for publication by Ricoeur himself. Instead, it is a collection of his essays originally compiled in 2009 by the Fonds Ricoeur. It is the second volume in Polity's Writings and Lectures (Écrits et conferences) series, whose broad aim is to provide English- speaking readers with access to Ricoeur's hard to find articles on a range of topics. While the first volume in the series was a collection of essays on psychoanalysis, this volume consists of five essays that were published separately from 1972 to 2006. Together, these essays offer a deeper understanding of Ricoeur's hermeneutics studies to scholars and, at the same time, provide a good overview for those who are new to his work.

Ricoeur is widely known for his contributions to the field of hermeneutics, the theory of interpretation. He, unlike some other hermeneuts, does not have a single book that presents his theory adequately. Of course, Ricoeur did publish an early book on hermeneutics -- The Conflict of Interpretations (1969) -- but it does not include the many later developments of his thought. Those later pieces, furthermore, take the form of journal articles and book chapters that are scattered across many different venues and languages. Some of these are collected in the volume From Text to Action (1991), although they too are limited primarily to the hermeneutics of text and action to the neglect of other extensions of his hermeneutics. The strength of Hermeneutics, in my opinion, is that it is the first to put on display the breadth of Ricoeur's hermeneutic theory -- ranging across the hermeneutics of myths, symbols, metaphor, texts, action, and revelation.

The first chapter -- "The Problem of Hermeneutics" -- stands out as perhaps the clearest and most insightful account of the development of Ricoeur's hermeneutic theory that I have read. This chapter is the text of a set of four lectures that were given in Florence, Italy in 1998. It is an instant classic that compares favorably to the essay "Intellectual Autobiography," which would be its closest rival. These lectures display a level of clarity and concision that can come only after decades of scholarship. They take decades of work on various topics and condense it into a single line of development leading from Ricoeur's earliest writings all the way up to his Oneself as Another (1990). As an excellent introduction not only to this volume but also to his intellectual itinerary, this chapter could easily be used as a stand-alone piece in any course on Ricoeur.

While the first chapter presents a broad overview of the trajectory of his thought, the other chapters tackle particular aspects of Ricoeur's hermeneutics. Though these chapters might be less widely known by French readers, English-speaking scholars may be disappointed to find that two of these chapters are already quite familiar. Chapter 2 - "Metaphor and the Central Problem of Hermeneutics" -- has already appeared in two journals and three edited books in English. It does have the merit of providing a synopsis of Ricoeur's The Rule of Metaphor (1975), but I do not think that English-speaking editors would have chosen it. Chapter 4 - "Hermeneutics of the Idea of Revelation" -- was initially published in 1977 in the Harvard Theological Review and later reprinted in Ricoeur's Essays on Biblical Interpretation. It too provides a nice complement to Ricoeur's Figuring the Sacred (1995). Both pieces are fine examples of Ricoeur's scholarship and are pertinent to an overall understanding of his hermeneutic theory, but due to their familiarity, I will set aside those chapters and instead focus my discussion on the two remaining.

Chapter 3 -- "Hermeneutical Logic"? -- is the text of a lecture that was first delivered in 1978 and published in French in 1981. This chapter would be a good focal point, if the text were adopted for a course on hermeneutics. It is a wide-ranging piece that situates Ricoeur in relation to Dilthey, Heidegger, Gadamer, and Habermas, and in this respect, echoes several chapters in From Text to Action (1991). Its primary focus is on two questions: first, whether the claims of hermeneutics are primarily epistemological (Dilthey) or ontological (Heidegger); second, whether the claims of hermeneutics are universal (Gadamer) or not (Habermas). Of special note is the "dialectical interpretation" of Truth and Method, which corrects certain emphases in Gadamer by establishing effective history within a dialectic of distance and belonging, or in other words, within a dialogue of question and answer with one's tradition. This ultimately provides the basis for Ricoeur's response to the Gadamer-Habermas debate, which he sums up in three replies to Habermas from a hermeneutic perspective. First, although hermeneutics starts from particular or limited fields of experience, it nonetheless has a universal aim. Second, instead of providing a narrow account of the causes of misunderstanding, Ricoeur's dialectic of understanding and explanation can accommodate the critical reflection called for by Habermas. Third, even though hermeneutics has a universal aim, it does not provide a "transcendental" condition of cognition. Hermeneutics, on Ricoeur's view, cannot offer the closure of a total reflection; instead it is an irreducibly open dialogue in constant struggle against the misunderstandings and distortions covering over the truth.

While much more could be said about the details of the argument Ricoeur develops, it should be pointed out that the chapter unfortunately closes with a rather muddled discussion of Wittgenstein and hermeneutics. The topic itself is worthwhile, because it could offer an unseen point of convergence between Analytic and Continental discourses. But it is hard to see how it fits into the rest of the chapter as well as how it can accomplish its overly ambitious aim in fewer than ten pages.

Given the difficulty of the topic, Ricoeur might better have focused on the potential connection between Heidegger and the later Wittgenstein, rather than attempting to cover both the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations. Heidegger and Wittgenstein each sees his own approach to philosophy as a "therapy" to treat the ills of traditional philosophical thought. The differences emerge, as Ricoeur rightly observes, in how they conceptualize its cure. For Heidegger this means going back to a more fundamental mode of thinking at the origin of philosophy, while for Wittgenstein philosophy itself is taken to be the disease.

This difference itself points to two different possibilities for hermeneutics: it can either be historically rooted or take place outside of history. Unfortunately, Ricoeur doesn't weigh in on this question, but it would not be hard to imagine from his treatment of the Gadamer-Habermas debate how he might have tried to mediate between these two alternatives. Instead of either stepping outside of the philosophical tradition or fantasizing a return to its pure origins, one can easily imagine that Ricoeur would say that philosophical thought is always in relation to its tradition but that this tradition is not static. Instead, philosophical thought is necessarily the product of a dialectic between tradition and innovation, continuity and change, belonging and distantiation.

Chapter 5 -- "Salvation Myths and Contemporary Reason" -- marks a theological extension of Ricoeur's hermeneutics and looks at the question of salvation through myth and history. Ricoeur begins by establishing a definition of myth and goes on to connect the Bible to the broader concept of salvation myths. He starts from the notion of myths of origin, which are like narratives but unfold on a different temporal level from them. Salvation myths, on Ricoeur's view, come to play an analogous role in response to the problem of evil. Myths of origin explain the origin of evil and suffering in the world, while salvation myths point to a reparation or restoration of what has been lost due to evil. Much confusion arises when these myths are taken solely on a literal level and inscribed within the history of the world. The chapter thus highlights the oft-neglected distinction between mythic narratives and historical narratives.

Ricoeur registers caution with respect to those who would try to incorporate the suffering of evil into history, or a "Heilsgeschichte," through a grand narrative. Against such a view, he registers two significant points. First, there is a multiple naming of suffering in the Bible. In addition to the narrative form, Ricoeur notes that there are also laws, prophecies, lamentations, and hymns that address the reality of suffering. For this reason, "the imposition of the form of one grand narrative on the diversity of texts and literary genres risks doing violence to the pluralistic richness of the theme of salvation" (163). Second, there is the enigma of "unjust suffering" which cannot be assimilated into the logic of retribution in which an individual gets what he or she deserves. The existence of unjust suffering in history -- Ricoeur's examples include the story of Job, the suffering of Christ, and the Shoah -- disturbs the structure of narratives and theodicies.

Since the history of suffering does not allow for a system or a grand narrative, it follows that the salvation of suffering cannot be known through a rational or narrative account. It remains a mystery. It is in response to such mysteries that salvation myths come to play an important role. They open up a non-utopian basis for hope -- a hope in spite of everything. In this respect, I think that the final chapter opens an issue that connects many different themes in Ricoeur's work, including myth, evil, history, narrative, and justice. I see a lot of potential for Ricoeur scholars to take his treatment of these themes into vital new directions.

While English-speaking scholars may be disappointed to find some previously available works in the book, they will enjoy the discovery of a couple of hidden gems. The loss in novelty, nonetheless, results in a gain in the volume's overall usability for the classroom. It is precisely what teachers need to bring Ricoeur's thought into their courses. Due to its accessibility and breadth, I can easily see this becoming the go-to volume for courses that include Ricoeur.