Hidden Wisdom: Medieval Contemplatives on Self-Knowledge, Reason, Love, Persons, and Immortality

Van Dyke Hidden Wisdom

Christina Van Dyke, Hidden Wisdom: Medieval Contemplatives on Self-Knowledge, Reason, Love, Persons, and Immortality, Oxford University Press, 2022, 222pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198861683.

Reviewed by Zita V. Toth, King’s College London


Christina Van Dyke’s book is a welcome addition to the growing scholarship on medieval philosophy in general, and on some under-represented medieval traditions in particular.[1]

The main aim of the book is to alert the reader to the fact that while it is customary to equate medieval philosophy between the twelfth and the fifteenth century with the scholastic tradition as practiced at the big universities, there were thinkers, especially mystics and contemplatives,[2] who do not neatly fit within those boundaries. Exploring the contemplative tradition also highlights the fact that despite the usual preconceptions, there were women writing between Hypatia and Princess Elizabeth, and what they wrote was philosophically interesting. Thus, the book aims to provide a “corrective and complementary” (1) approach to the history of philosophy: corrective insofar as it steers us away from an unjustifiably narrow focus, and complementary insofar as it provides a way to broaden our usual canon.

After a brief “Preface”, the book is divided into six chapters, with loosely connected “Interludes” between them that usually provide some historical background. The first chapter introduces the reader to the methodology, and justifies the corrective and complementary approach offered in the book. Apart from the already mentioned customarily narrow focus of historians of medieval philosophy on the scholastic tradition, the chapter argues that at least some of the medieval mystics have been largely neglected because contemporary philosophy of religion unduly restricts the notion of mystical experience to disembodied states. While in the apophatic mystical tradition, the union with God indeed occurs by negating the physical (and sometimes even the mental) self, nonetheless, as the book will illustrate, apophatic mysticism was but one strand among a variety of views about this union, and especially women mystics often described their mystical experience as essentially embodied. As will be seen throughout the book, these two traditions—the apophatic, on the one hand, and the affective, on the other hand—resulted in a great diversity among medieval mystics. While many thinkers in the latter tradition were women, it was not exclusively so, and indeed, as Van Dyke notes at the very beginning, “there is often more commonality [. . .] between women and men of the same religious order and geographic region than between women of different religious orders or centuries” (2).

The first interlude provides a list and timeline of the discussed thinkers, with short biographies and some rather nice (grayscale) images.

The second chapter turns to the issue of self-knowledge, which was regarded as a prerequisite of the virtuous and religious life by most thinkers of the period. While the usual scholastic texts mostly focus on the mechanics of this self-knowledge (what we know and how), the mystical texts emphasize its moral and religious significance, including its role in the life to come. The chapter examines many thinkers’ views on various aspects of self-knowledge: how to develop it by regular exercise of introspection and meditation, the importance of community and neighbors as “mirrors”, how to root it in humility especially by loving these neighbors, or how to use reason and imagination to eliminate harmful inclinations that would hinder it. The second part of the chapter illustrates again the divide between the apophatic and the affective traditions: while the former regards self-knowledge as a necessary tool that eventually must be abandoned (since the self itself will be abandoned when united with God, the latter regards self-knowledge as a lasting feature in the union with God. Consequently, as Van Dyke argues, the affective tradition also puts greater emphasis on bodily sensory experiences, which it regards both as essential for the development of the self and as instrumental for knowing God.

The second interlude provides an introduction to the beguines, a community of lay women especially popular (and populous—there were around 1500 women living in beguine houses in Strasbourg alone by 1300!) in the Low Countries and in Germany. Many of the women authors treated in the book belonged to the beguine community.

The third chapter gives an overview of the role of reason and rationality in the contemplative tradition. Virtually all thinkers in the period considered reason to be an essential part of human nature, i.e., the power of the soul by which we form abstract concepts and make judgments in both theoretical and practical matters; and they also agreed that reason alone is not sufficient to achieve mystical union with God. But regarding the question of what the precise role of reason is, the usual line of division between the apophatic and the affective tradition generated a diverse spectrum of views. On one end of this spectrum, some thinkers (such as Meister Eckhart or Mechthild of Magdeburg) claimed that reason must be abandoned once contemplation is achieved, referencing the Biblical story of Rachel (allegory of reason) dying while giving birth to Benjamin (contemplation). On the other end of the spectrum, some (e.g., Angela of Foligno or Julian of Norwich) held that mystical experience, far from being contrary to reason, results in both practical and theoretical knowledge. Many others occupied some middle ground, maintaining that while reason cannot get us all the way to God, it is a necessary (if not sufficient) means to achieve the highest form of contemplation, since, as for instance Christine de Pizan puts it, it carries the mirror of self-knowledge and (as Bonaventure does) it helps to regulate the will’s love.

The third interlude discusses some artistic representations of women with books, which highlighted the importance of the written word and became a sign of religious devotion.

The fourth chapter discusses the contemplatives’ take on the role of will and love. After giving some general (broadly Aristotelian with some Augustinian slant) background, it turns to explore the role of the will in the practices of meditation and contemplation. On the one hand, meditation engages our affective powers, which then enables us to develop virtues both in the will and in the intellect; thus, both the will and the (rightly directed) sensory appetites are necessary for meditative practice. Contemplation, on the other hand, is unmediated contact with the divine. While medieval mystics agree that meditating on Christ’s (embodied) life constitutes an important preparatory step for the contemplative union, they disagree on how far that preparatory step extends. As we can expect from the already seen lines of division, some (in the apophatic tradition) think that imaginative meditation should be transcended and given up altogether, while others (in the affective tradition) think that it should be practiced even when contemplation is achieved. These latter authors regard the imitation of Christ via our imaginative power as a constitutive part of the union, and connectedly, give love a central role to play in contemplation. The chapter closes with the interesting consideration that assigning increasing importance to love was instrumental for women authors: since even in the Aristotelian-Galenic biological tradition, women (partly due to their defective bodily constitution) can at least love better than their male counterparts, it gave increasing epistemic authority to women when speaking about their (love-oriented) mystical experience.

The fourth interlude explores the genre of courtly love (fin’amor), and how it was borrowed and transformed by contemplative writers whose texts were meant to be accessible and engaging intellectually as well as emotionally.

The fifth chapter gives an overview of the notion and role of ‘person’. It starts with a brief sketch of the different contexts in which scholastic authors dealt with personhood. This includes grammar and logic, where the focus was on distinguishing persons from classes and universals, and hence persons were considered as essentially individual and incommunicable; legal and political considerations, where persona often served as a synonym for ‘human being’, both in just war theory and in defending the inherent dignity of persons as their distinguishing characteristic; and theology and metaphysics, where ‘person’ was defined (after Boethius) as an individual substance with a rational nature. As Van Dyke argues, contemplative texts often exhibited a wider range of voices than their scholastic counterparts. In this wider literature, personhood is strongly tied to affective devotional piety and to the awareness of the self, and is often represented by inner dialogues. Again, what this self really is, or what role it plays in the final union with God, differs from author to author, along the (by now) usual lines. As the chapter also argues, the contemplative tradition works with a narrative sense of self (a “unified and reflective consciousness that persists through changes over time” (171)), and in this, it foreshadows some later developments, most notably John Locke’s conception and that of some theistic personalists in contemporary philosophy of religion. (While the chapter also suggests that the Boethian conception is insufficient to account for the phenomena that Locke and the theistic personalists are interested in, whether this is indeed the case would require some further investigation.)

The fifth, last interlude in the book offers some interesting insights into the (seemingly) self-deprecatory style of medieval (and we should note, early modern) women writers. As Van Dyke shows, some of these self-deprecatory remarks are what we may call ‘humility topoi’, which occur in all kinds of contexts (including such notable figures as Anselm of Canterbury). Thus, it indicates a rather self-conscious engagement with the theological and philosophical debates of the day, and also establishes God as the writer’s source of authority.

The last, sixth chapter focuses on immortality and the afterlife, especially on the problem of how to maintain that (1) there is bodily resurrection, and nevertheless (2) our soul survives our bodily death. Again, just like the scholastic one, the contemplative tradition offered a variety of views, skewing either towards a kind of Platonism (by emphasizing (2)) or towards a kind of Aristotelianism (by emphasizing (1)). The chapter revisits once again the two main mystical traditions, and argues that it is more difficult for the apophatic tradition to account for bodily resurrection, while the affective tradition can maintain that union with God can be embodied. As Van Dyke concludes along these lines, the “acceptance of embodied mystical states, I would argue, actually constitutes the most important distinction between the apophatic and affective mindset” (193). Towards the end of the chapter, we also see two case studies of how some scholastics dealt with the problem: namely, Robert Grosseteste (ca. 1168–1253) and Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274).

Overall, the book clearly accomplishes its aim to address the history of medieval philosophy in a corrective and complementary way, and I only offer two minor critical remarks: one more philosophical, the other more editorial. On the more philosophical side, I did not find the case studies of Grosseteste and Aquinas at the end very helpful or necessary, either in themselves or in the context of the book as a whole. In themselves, they are of course very brief—which is more than justified, given that they merely serve to place these authors on the spectrum presented above. But even with the brevity, perhaps it would have been useful to refer to the long-standing Augustinian tradition of which Grosseteste is heir (interestingly, Plato’s name occurs several times in this section, but Augustine’s does not), and to Grosseteste’s metaphysics of light, which is intertwined with his theory of illumination. The reader may have also been interested in some of the contemporary literature dealing with Aquinas’s stance on the afterlife. Regarding their place in the book as a whole, the case studies are also somewhat puzzling, as they belong to the tradition that is not the main focus here. While they do provide a contrast, perhaps it could have been made more starkly by including a comparable analysis of one or two authors in the contemplative tradition. However, the treatment of contemplatives, just as it is throughout the book, is more focused on general trends than on individual authors.

On the editorial side, while the alternation of chapters and interludes provides an enjoyable rhythm, the book as a whole could have been tighter (as Van Dyke notes, some of the chapters had been based on previously published papers, and that is especially evident in the later part). Thus, we encounter a fair amount of repetition especially in Chapter 5 about the disagreement between apophatic and affective mystics regarding our final end, and many of the recurring authors in the book are introduced multiple times, quasi acquiring a Homeric epithet (such as, among others, the “influential fourteenth-century English mystic” Richard Rolle, or the “thirteenth-century Carthusian nun” Marguerite d’Oingt). This seems especially unnecessary given the first Interlude where all the authors are introduced, although it may help readers who read the chapters out of order. We also encounter issues towards the end of the book that would have had a more beneficial effect had they been flagged at the very beginning: for instance, we receive a somewhat lengthy overview of the various languages and the growing preference for the vernacular as opposed to Latin in Chapter 5, and there is a review of the relevant genres of literature in the Fourth Interlude.

But these are minor quibbles, and the book is an excellent introduction to philosophical ideas present in the medieval contemplative tradition. As Van Dyke acknowledges, there is much more work to be done on each of the authors and topics discussed (and perhaps on other topics as well); but it is a starting point for both medievalists trying to broaden their interests, and perhaps scholars in other disciplines who are familiar with the authors in other contexts but would like to glimpse some of their philosophical insights. Doing this, of course, necessarily comes at a price: for the sake of accessibility, the primary texts are not provided in their original (which may be somewhat frustrating for a medievalist); while, for the sake of brevity, some of the philosophical and theological concepts—phantasm, abstraction, narrative self, original sin, etc.,—are left unexplained (which may be somewhat daunting for the non-philosopher). But the picture emerging from the book is a clear and compelling one: the views within the medieval contemplative tradition were as diverse as those in the scholastic framework, and philosophically just as interesting. The book would also provide a nice companion to more mainstream authors in a graduate-level philosophy class (and, perhaps certain parts, even for undergraduates).

The book contains a detailed table of contents, a list of figures, as well as an index, and is illustrated throughout with some beautiful images of the relevant thinkers, places, and ideas. As Van Dyke notes, this is hopefully not the last word on this subject; indeed, for instance, it would be particularly helpful for teachers of medieval philosophy to have access to an anthology of at least some of the sources treated here, similar to those available for the early modernist.[3]

But, as Van Dyke notes, it “is a momentous time to be a medievalist” (206), and books like this open plenty of new avenues for further work.

[1] The growth is incremental and, apart from a few centers, rather slow. Van Dyke provides some surprising examples, to which we may also add that, for instance, the only medieval philosophical anthology existing in Hungarian, published in 2020, does not contain a single figure outside of the Latin scholastic tradition.

[2] Van Dyke uses these terms interchangeably, and so will I in this review.

[3] A widely available one is Women Philosophers of the Early Modern Period, ed. Margaret Atherton (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994).