Higher-Order Evidence and Moral Epistemology

Higher Order Evidence And Moral Epistemology Book Cover

Michael Klenk (ed.), Higher-Order Evidence and Moral Epistemology, Routledge, 2019, 269pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367343200.

Reviewed by Joshua C. Thurow, The University of Texas at San Antonio


This timely collection of essays explores a bustling area of moral epistemology, namely, how higher-order evidence affects the rationality of moral beliefs. Arguments from disagreement between moral peers and evolutionary debunking arguments both employ higher-order evidence to try to establish that some/many/all of our moral beliefs are unjustified and do not amount to knowledge. Epistemology has also seen much discussion of higher-order evidence more broadly, and these essays each bring deep familiarity with this literature to moral epistemology. What results is a collection that discusses a buffet of arguments: various defenses of debunking arguments, various criticisms of debunking arguments, a debunking argument against objective consequentialism, arguments about how pessimism about the justificational force of moral testimony relates to higher-order evidence from disagreement, an argument that fanatics may not be rational in their fanatical beliefs because of an inappropriate appreciation of higher-order evidence, a defense of a certain kind of level-splitting in moral beliefs for non-conciliationists, and an argument that the method all of these disputes uses is faulty. Clearly there is a lot packed into this collection. I can't discuss all of it here, so I'll focus on just a few themes and theses, occasionally offering replies.

First, several authors defend moral debunking arguments. Norbert Paulo argues that we have reason to think that our moral intuitions are not reliable because we have evidence that intuitions are sensitive to irrelevant factors (such as a believer's personality and mood, and how different cases are ordered and framed). Moral intuitions, he says, are not as sensitive to irrelevant factors as many critics have supposed; nevertheless, they are sensitive to a wide range of factors, some having a small effect on one's moral intuitions, others having a larger effect. Furthermore, we have no systematic explanation for why moral intuitions are sensitive as they are to irrelevant factors. This constitutes higher-order evidence that moral intuitions are not, as he puts it, "minimally reliable," where a minimally reliable process is one that mostly is not sensitive to irrelevant factors, and when it is sensitive to such a factor, its sensitivity can be explained. We shouldn't trust sources that we are justified in believing are not minimally reliable.

Rather than debunk or undermine moral beliefs in general, Paul Silva argues that objective consequentialism is particularly vulnerable to a debunking argument that we lack justified moral beliefs. Silva assumes (i) that justification is to be understood as something like being in a position to know, and (ii) knowledge requires sensitivity and/or safety. Given these assumptions, since my belief that I have bought a losing lottery ticket is unsafe (because I could easily have won, even if my winning was unlikely), I am not in a position to know that my ticket is losing, and thus I also am not justified in believing my ticket will lose. Similarly, Silva argues, objective consequentialists cannot be justified in holding high-stakes moral beliefs -- beliefs that an action is wrong where that action clearly has very bad short term consequences, such as murdering the entire Rohinga population of Myanmar. Although it would be unlikely, the long term effects could easily turn out to be largely positive if, e.g., this were the genocide that finally produced decisive change in how the international community approaches genocide. The objective consequentialist, I suspect, may have a couple ways to deal with this problem. First, one could embrace expected rather than actual results consequentialism. Second, the objective consequentialist could observe that we are justified in believing that probably the genocide is wrong and, furthermore, given Silva's epistemological assumptions, there will also be very many non-moral matters where at most we can be justified in believing that probably p (e.g., probably my car is where I left it). If those who embrace Silva's epistemological assumptions are willing to bite the latter bullets, why not the bullets about moral justification?

Olle Risberg and Folke Tersman suggest that higher-order evidence (when it undermines a belief) should be understood as providing an undercutting defeater. An undercutting defeater for p defeats p by providing evidence against some claim that is used to support p. Moral disagreement can function as an undercutting defeater for our moral beliefs by providing evidence that our moral seemings are not reliable. And that our seemings are reliable, they suggest, is one of the linking beliefs we use to justify any moral belief. They suggest the same is true for our other belief sources: memory beliefs are based on a belief that our memory is reliable, perceptual beliefs are based on a belief that our sense perception is reliable, etc. They grant that this view is somewhat unintuitive, but they attempt to explain away our sense that sometimes we do not base our beliefs on these sorts of beliefs by noting that explanations are generally context-sensitive; we cite an event as an explanation in some contexts but not in others. When we don't think a general belief that our memory is reliable is playing a justifying role in some memory belief, they suggest this is because appealing to that general belief is not salient in the context. It remains to be seen if their explanation can be made good, but I suspect there are two reasons for thinking it will not be made good. First, surely many children have justified beliefs but do not have linking beliefs about their faculties, or their exercising of their faculties on those occasions, being reliable. Second, Lewis Carroll's tortoise and Achilles dialogue indicates that we can't lay out every justificatory factor as a premise; there will still be the issue of whether the transition from the premises to the conclusion is justifiable or rational, and so there could well be higher-order evidence that the transition is not good and this higher-order evidence won't challenge a background supporting belief.

Second, several authors attempt to rebut moral debunking arguments and arguments from disagreement. Silvan Wittwer considers debunking arguments that attempt to give higher-order evidence of error -- i.e., that provide evidence that our beliefs are likely to be mistaken. Wittwer endorses Katia Vavova's response to these arguments, which is that they are self-undermining because in order to justify the claim that moral beliefs are likely to be mistaken one needs to have a fair bit of moral knowledge to see that some moral claims are false. Wittwer then examines whether the debunking argument can evade this objection by embracing Thomas Kelly's total evidence view. Wittwer argues that this likely will not work, as there is considerable disagreement about what the epistemic effects of evolutionary explanations should be. So it is not clear what the higher-order evidence favors, and the first-order evidence seems clearly to favor some moral beliefs.

One of the standout essays of the collection is by Brian C. Barnett. Barnett concisely develops a sophisticated account of higher-order evidence and argues that, on that account, disagreement and debunking arguments provide at most partial defeat of moral beliefs. According to Barnett, E2 fully defeats E1 concerning p iff

(1) the agent possesses E2 and E1, (2) the agent does not possess an undefeated full defeater for E2, (3) either (a) E2 is directly hostile to E1 and latches onto it, in which case E2 has at least some undercutting power, or (b) E2 is tangentially hostile to E1 and meets the conditions of filtration, in which case E2 has rebutting power, albeit dampened, and (4) E2's hostility is sufficiently strong: its rebutting or undercutting power . . . surpasses the minimal threshold (p. 122)

for full defeat. He thinks disagreement and debunking arguments are best characterized as being directly hostile to our evidence, E1, for our moral beliefs -- that is, they are evidence that E1 is flawed in some way. His key premise is that when E2 supports that it is inscrutable whether E1 makes it likely that p, then E2 at most provides partial defeat for E1, and so one's belief in p, based on E1, is still justified, albeit with less confidence. And he thinks that it is typically inscrutable whether a given person is my peer, and it is also inscrutable whether there are non-evolutionary reliable explanations for our moral beliefs in addition to evolutionary explanations. This is a fascinating move, but I wonder if it is too good to be true. It seems inappropriate to believe that "p, but it is inscrutable whether my evidence makes p at all likely to be true." This appears to be a kind of epistemic akrasia that many find unacceptable. Compare this proposition to one about athletic performance. "The shot is going in the basket, but it is inscrutable whether my shooting it in this way makes it at all likely to go in." That proposition seems clearly irrational. If it is inscrutable to me as to whether my shooting this way makes it at all likely the ball will go in the basket, I shouldn't believe that it will.

Marco Tiozzo discusses two issues that needs more attention: whether higher-order evidence (i) undermines propositional or doxastic justification for the target belief, and (ii) provides objective or subjective defeat. Tiozzo dismisses the view that higher-order evidence provides objective defeat of propositional justification because he thinks level-splitting views haven't been clearly refuted (on those views, higher-order evidence about p would give me evidence about whether my belief that p was justified, but that evidence doesn't affect whether my belief actually was justified). He ends up arguing that higher-order evidence is most plausibly understood as providing subjective defeat of doxastic justification. It is subjective in that higher-order evidence undermining p doesn't defeat unless you believe that you have higher-order evidence undermining p, and it defeats doxastic justification because, Tiozzo argues, one of the requirements of holding a belief rationally is not violating a constraint against akrasia. Given this account of higher-order evidence, Tiozzo argues that most people's moral beliefs will not be defeated by disagreement or debunking arguments because most people don't believe that those arguments undermine our moral beliefs. They thus will lack the subjective defeater.

Another standout paper is by Michael Huemer, "Debunking Skepticism." Characteristically clear and provocative, Huemer argues that second-order evidence for moral skepticism -- arguments that attempt to show that there is something defective about our evidence for our moral beliefs (disagreement and debunking arguments are of this sort) -- is itself debunked by third-order evidence that those arguments result from an unreliable belief-forming mechanism. We have reason to doubt these second-order skeptical arguments because, Huemer argues, we have good reason to think that philosophers are biased in favor of skeptical theses and arguments. Why? Philosophers take seriously skeptical arguments about nearly every subject matter. They "appear to be more skeptical about the things that they study than are researchers in any other field" (p. 162) and they disagree widely about the quality of skeptical arguments. He offers various theories as to why philosophers are biased towards skepticism and responds to various possible defenses of philosophers against the charge. But I suspect philosophers merely appear more skeptical because their job is to evaluate propositions other disciplines take for granted; evaluation takes the form of investigating their grounds, and skeptical arguments are ways of doing that. Philosophers more often use skeptical arguments as tools to evaluate certain combinations of claims (e.g., classical internalism can't be true because it entails skepticism) rather than as arguments for skepticism. In addition, ordinary people are skeptical of some claims more than others. Although there are some moral claims people are not skeptical of, moral claims as a class people tend to be more skeptical of. So perhaps philosophers aren't biased in being more inclined to accept moral skeptical arguments; they may be right in line with average people.

Sadly, I can only spend a short amount of space on the remaining essays, which are also interesting and of high quality. Marcus Lee, Neil Sinclair, and Jon Robson argue that none of the reasons that pessimists about moral testimony give for thinking that people should not accept moral claims merely on the basis of testimony implies that they should not adjust their beliefs in light of higher-order evidence from disagreement. They conclude with an interesting argument that the testimony of moral bastards -- people who reliably judge moral issues, but also fail to follow through on their moral beliefs -- do not provide higher-order evidence that one should revise one's moral beliefs. Thus, there are special cases where moral testimony cannot play a higher-order role, but in many cases it can. J. Adam Carter and Dario Mortini explain the pessimist's view using a robust virtue epistemology that says "S knows a moral proposition, p, only if S's believing p truly is primarily creditable to S's exercise of (morally relevant) cognitive ability" (p. 201). They then argue that this robust virtue epistemology implies that collective moral knowledge is highly fragile and easily defeated by higher-order evidence. They present this as a challenge for pessimistic non-skeptics about moral knowledge, since presumably non-skeptics will want to allow for robust collective moral knowledge as well as individual moral knowledge.

Joshua DiPaolo engages in applied epistemology, investigating whether fanatics have at hand higher-order evidence that undermines their fanatical beliefs. He says fanatics will typically be aware of disagreement from outsiders and from people who have exited their communities, and fanatics are typically told not to trust their own judgments. DiPaolo explains why fanatics will typically reject this higher-order evidence, but refrains from judging whether they are unjustified in doing so. Margaret Greta Turnbull and Eric Sampson argue that non-conciliationists about disagreement can at the same time justifiably hold their moral belief that p, think they have properly assessed the factors morally relevant to p, and believe that they have peers such that the morally relevant factors, as understood by the peers, do not support p. They argue that this combination of attitudes is intellectually virtuous.

Lastly, Justin Clarke-Doane casts a pox on all the houses. He argues that all of these debates about the epistemic impact of higher-order evidence rest upon an assumption that if we could just get the epistemic facts straight we would then know how to believe. But he argues that even if we epistemically should respond to evidence in a certain way, there are concepts according to which we epistemically should* not respond to the evidence in that way. The question then is which norm to follow. More epistemology doesn't help; what we need is practical reason.

In sum, this is a rich collection of essays from which researchers and students in both epistemology and moral philosophy will benefit. It both deepens and broadens our understanding of higher-order evidence, disagreement, and debunking arguments, and I expect several of the essays in this collection will influence future work of these issues.