Hilary Putnam: Pragmatism and realism, Routledge

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Conant, James and Zeglen, Urszula M. (eds.), Hilary Putnam: Pragmatism and realism, Routledge, 2002, 256pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-415-25605-4.

Reviewed by Gabor Forrai, University of Miskolc


The book is an outgrowth of a 1998 conference held at the Nicholas Copernicus University in Toru (Poland), for which Hilary Putnam was the keynote speaker. It contains eleven papers with responses by Putnam, and is divided into two parts, one on pragmatism and one on realism. Each part is prefaced by a short and well-focused introduction by Urszula M. Zeglen, which may be useful for those who did not keep up with the development of Putnam’s thought since the late seventies. Some papers are directly addressed to Putnam, seeking to challenge or support him on particular points, but more of them aim at developing themes on which Putnam has a view. I will discuss only some of the papers; the others will be listed at the end of this review.

Ruth Anna Putnam’s “Taking pragmatism seriously” and Hilary Putnam’s own “Pragmatism and nonscientific knowledge” survey the issues with respect to which the latter claims to be an heir to classical pragmatism. The most important of these are as follows:

(1) Philosophy should not lose contact with general human concerns. What this means is that the common man’s views which are integral to human practices should not be brushed aside as if they were necessarily inferior to the sophisticated technical doctrines of professional philosophers. Even though the commonly held views may not be right as they stand, the philosophical views which are opposed to them – such as skepticism about the external world, indirect realist theories of perception, denial of the cognitive status of ethics – are more suspect. It follows then that one important task for a philosopher who takes pragmatism seriously is to expose the fallacies underlying those philosophical doctrines, which seem incredible for the layman. No wonder that Wittgenstein and Austin are just as much philosophical heroes for Putnam as Peirce, James and Dewey.
(2) Rejection of the sharp separation of theoretical and practical concerns and the fact/value dichotomy. Many philosophers tend to exalt science and regard it as pure inquiry, completely detached from rather than continuous with nonscientific knowledge. As a part of this picture they maintain that science is unaffected by value considerations. Scientific knowledge is supposed to be the product of experience and certain methods, which, as a matter of fact, lead to truth or high probability. Putnam rejects this attitude. He maintains that scientific methods cannot be applied in a blind, mechanical fashion. Their application presupposes judgments about coherence and simplicity, which are value judgments, just like the judgments in ethics. As result, knowledge of facts depends on knowledge of values. The dependence goes in the other direction as well: knowledge of values presupposes knowledge of facts.
(3) Value judgments can be objective. This is a straightforward consequence of the previous point. Since factual claims are infected by values, the subjectivity of values would entail the subjectivity of facts. But what does objectivity mean here? For Putnam a claim is objective if it is free of personal idiosyncrasies, and the way to weed out idiosyncrasies is rational argumentation. In the final analysis, objectivity is what rational argumentation delivers. However, rational argumentation should not be equated with a particular set of practices, for two reasons. First, rationality is manifold. Different issues call for different ways of argumentation. Second, rationality is not static. We may develop new ways of arguing and we may also revise our previous practices. (This is another point where Putnam is indebted to Wittgenstein.)

This picture of objectivity brings us to the second main theme of the book, realism and truth. Putnam is famous for rejecting metaphysical realism, the view that the character of reality is wholly independent of human practices, and truth means capturing what is out there independently of how anyone would regard it. He has recommended two pictures for its replacement, first ‘internal realism’, best summarized in Reason, Truth and History (Cambridge, Mass.: Cambridge University Press, 1981), then ‘natural realism’, which was first spelled out in his Dewey lectures (“Sense, Nonsense, and the Senses: An Inquiry into the Powers of the Human Mind”, Journal of Philosophy 91 (1994): 445-517, reprinted as Part I The Threefold Chord: Mind, Body and the World, New York: Columbia University Press, 1999).

Internal realism is a modest version of verificationism, maintaining that the truth conditions of statements are not independent of their verification conditions, as a result of which truth is epistemically constrained. It is discussed in two papers, Nicholas Rescher’s “Knowledge of the truth in pragmatic perspective” and Wolfgang Künne’s “From alethic anti-realism to alethic realism”. Rescher takes Putnam to be tempted to identify truth with verification and claims that the identification will not work. For actual verification may not give us the truth, and ideal verification is so far from where we are now that truth becomes as elusive as it is according to the correspondence theory, which he, like Putnam, rejects. It seems to him that Putnam has no better solution for closing the gap between verification and truth than suggesting that we ignore it and seek refuge in the democratic consideration that we are all in the same boat. Rescher’s own approach is to keep truth conceptually independent of verification and close the gap in the following way. We should estimate truth relying on our methods of verification and then assess these methods themselves by asking whether the views these methods favor ‘provide materials for successful prediction and effective applicative control’ (73). In his response Putnam explains where Rescher got him wrong, which is useful because he is often understood in Rescher’s way, i. e. as if he were proposing to reduce truth to verification rather than emphasizing the mutual dependence of the two. But misunderstandings of this kind are excusable for it is not easy to follow how Putnam has struggled with the concept of truth. Künne’s paper does a very nice job of clarifying that. It also contains a new version of Fitch’s argument against the idea that truth is epistemically constrained. What makes this version interesting is that it makes relatively weak assumptions. It talks of ‘justified belief’ rather than ‘knowledge’, does not use logical principles which the intuitionists would reject and does not involve substitution into modal contexts.

Putnam’s more recent natural realism differs from internal realism in two respects. First, verificationism becomes even more modest. He used to hold that truth and verification are conceptually linked. Now he does not believe this is true for all statements. There are indeed many statements whose truth conditions we cannot understand without knowing what would verify them, but not all statements are of this kind. The second and more important difference is that Putnam has become a direct realist about perception. The picture he rejects is this. The process of perception divides into a causal and a cognitive part. The things affecting our senses bring about mental or physical items in the mind or the brain (sense data, qualia, or representations, which are outputs of sensory modules), and it is to these items that we have cognitive access to. In Putnam’s opinion, however, cognition does not end within the mind or the brain but extends all the way to the object. This is not a call for a change in terminology; what Putnam wants is not to reclassify the causal part as cognitive. He rejects that there are two parts. Perception is a direct transaction between the mind and the thing, and there is no interface between the two. This view is challenged from different directions by John Haldane and Tadeusz Szubka. Haldane’s “Realism with a metaphysical skull” initiates a new round in his ongoing exchange with Putnam. They agree that metaphysical realism creates an unbridgeable gap between the mind and the world, but they disagree about the way of closing it. Haldane suggests we go back to Aristotle: in perception the mind takes on the form of the thing perceived. Since the very same form is present in the mind and in the thing, there is just no gap. He welcomes Putnam’s new position as a step in the right direction, but he believes that the sort of Aristotelian epistemological realism Putnam has adopted cannot be sustained without the support of Aristotelian metaphysics. The mind cannot touch reality unless there is something the mind and reality have in common, and that item must have all the important characteristics of Aristotelian forms. Putnam, not surprisingly, would have no truck with forms, which he finds completely unintelligible. What he particularly dislikes about Haldane’s suggestion is its essentialism, the idea that things can be individuated and ordered into kinds only in one specific way.

In his “The causal theory of perception and direct realism” Szubka argues that, contrary to what Putnam says, the causal theory of perception is compatible with direct realism. Putnam is right only about the reductive versions of the causal theory, which hold that we can give an exhaustive account of perception in causal terms and can safely dispense with unreduced intentional notions. Non-reductive causal theories, like Strawson’s, escape Putnam’s arguments and are fully compatible with direct realism. Even though Szubka makes a number of good points, I am not sure that he gets right what is at issue between Strawson and Putnam. Occasionally, he seems to take Putnam to maintain that there are perceptual experiences within our minds (112, 113), but these resist reduction. Strawson would probably accept this, but Putnam would not because it is the very idea of intermediary entities which he regards as flawed. Szubka seems to favor a non-reductionist, causal, direct realist view, which, however, I cannot clearly distinguish from the purely terminological version of direct realism, albeit he appears to accept that direct realism should not be bought for cheap by means of a simple linguistic reform (112).

Charles Travis’s “What laws of logic say” is one of the highlights of the book. It takes up an issue Putnam has grappled with throughout his career, the nature of logical necessity. Relying on Wittgenstein’s remarks in the Investigations (§§96-131) he sketches an account the consequences of which agree very well with what Putnam says on this subject. His central ideas are as follows. A system of formal logic is an idealized system of inferential relations between linguistic forms. It is defined by strict rules, and it is these rules, which make the inferential relations described in the system necessary. So, necessity is intrinsic to the system. The reason why systems of logic do not seem to admit refutations is that they do not say much. In particular, they do not say that natural language as a whole or even a particular segment of a natural language agrees with the system. If the logical connectives as used in a particular stretch of discourse fail to behave as the connectives of a system of logic (i.e. if we refuse to draw the conclusions we should draw if we were to apply the system to this stretch of discourse), then all that follows is that the system is not applicable to that particular stretch of discourse. It does not follow that the system is wrong. The crucial idea is that logical form is not inherent in language, but rather it is imposed on language if we choose to view it through a particular system. A particular system makes no commitment with regard to other systems: it does not say that it is the only possible system. Nor does it say what other systems must be like. And it does not even say that other systems must attribute the same logical form to a particular statement as the system in question. This shows that the connection between the meaning of the logical connectives of ordinary language and logical systems is looser than it is usually assumed. For example, a particular way of using the ordinary ‘or’ can be viewed through different logical systems, so the meaning of the ordinary ‘or’ cannot be associated with one particular logic. However, this kind of distance between ordinary speech and systems of logic does not imply that logical systems can never prove to be false. A system imposes several different constraints on the items, which figure in logical forms. And it might happen that under the pressure the world puts on our discourse we have to adopt ways of speaking so that the different constraints cannot be jointly satisfied. On the other hand, we cannot now envisage what a situation of this sort would be like.

Apart from the ones mentioned so far there are four more papers in the volume. Richard Warner describes how pragmatist themes emerge in the discussion about legal reasoning. Robert Brandom seeks to entangle the relationship between various kinds of pragmatism. John Heil argues that we should not assume that for every predicate which holds of an object there must be a specific property which the predicate designates. Giving up this assumption, which was basic to the functionalist philosophy of mind, means getting rid of the idea that there are higher and lower level properties. Gary Ebbs sharpens Putnam’s argument against deflationism and develops a version of deflationism which can escape it.

Putnam is an important thinker, and this collection devoted to his work is welcome, especially because his views have changed considerably since the last collection of this kind was published (Reading Putnam, edited by P. Clark and B. Hale, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1994.) This is a rich book, which covers the most important themes from Putnam’s work in the last 25 years. Those who work on Putnam should definitely read it. But some of the papers will also be valuable to those who are interested in the same issues as Putnam, even if they are not specifically interested in his work.