Hilbert's Programs and Beyond

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Wilfried Sieg, Hilbert's Programs and Beyond, Oxford University Press, 2013, 439 pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195372229.

Reviewed by Stewart Shapiro, The Ohio State University


The standard view is that David Hilbert proposed his famous "Program" in the mid-1920s. One key idea is that only the small chunk of mathematics that deals with intuitively evident properties of finitary objects, such as natural numbers and strings on a given alphabet, is taken to be contentful. This part needs no foundation; it is as evident as can be. The rest of mathematics -- higher-order arithmetic, real analysis, functional analysis, set theory, etc. -- is dubbed "ideal", because it deals with the infinite. The goal of the Program is to shore up the ideal parts of mathematics, by providing a sound epistemological basis for them.

The first stage in the Program was for each ideal mathematical theory to be completely formalized. The axioms should be formulated in a rigorous, formal language, and the logic should be made explicit, through an effective deductive system. Then the formal system itself can be studied as a mathematical object in its own right, by the contentful, finitary theory. Thus the view is sometimes called "formalism" and sometimes called "finitism" (see Tait [1981]).

The next stage in the Program was for the syntactic, deductive consistency of each "ideal" mathematical theory, as formalized, to be established in the contentful, finitary arithmetic. The latter is an absolutely secure theory, or at least as secure as is possible. The contentful proof of the consistency of the original "ideal" mathematical theory serves as a final, epistemological grounding for it. Once the Program is established, then, as Hilbert [1925] put it, "no one will drive us from the paradise which Cantor created for us".

The standard view continues that Kurt Gödel's [1931], [1934] celebrated incompleteness theorems dealt a final deathblow to the Hilbert Program. The lethal element was the second-incompleteness theorem that shows that no sufficiently rich mathematical theory can establish its own consistency. So there is no hope of establishing the consistency of, say, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory within that theory, let alone in a weaker theory like the finitary arithmetic of the Hilbert Program.

The standard view thus concludes that the Hilbert Program has only a historical interest. The Program was once one of the three major paradigms in the foundations and philosophy of mathematics (along with intuitionism and logicism), but it has no bearing on any metaphysical or epistemological issues in the contemporary philosophy of mathematics -- thanks to Gödel. Of course, the thriving field of proof theory, within contemporary mathematical logic, traces its roots to the Hilbert Program, but the Program itself no longer has any interesting fallout for the practice of mathematics and mathematical logic, nor for the philosophy of mathematics.

Over the past twenty-five years or so, Wilfried Sieg has argued persuasively against most aspects of this standard view. There is, first, no such thing as the Hilbert Program. Hilbert's views, along with those of his main students and collaborators, notably Paul Bernays, evolved considerably over a period of some forty years, sometimes in reaction to results within mathematics, and sometimes due to interactions with colleagues, collaborators, and opponents. This is reflected in the plural phrase, Hilbert's Programs, in the title of the present volume. Second, and perhaps more important, although the incompleteness theorems did provide a major setback to the epistemological goals of Hilbert and his collaborators, the extensive results from proof theory, spawned by Hilbert and his school, provide a basis for a sound and compelling epistemological basis for higher mathematics (even if the basis is not as compelling as a successful Program would have it).

The present volume collects sixteen of Sieg's essays on these topics, in a uniform format and with a common bibliography. Most were published individually; some are taken from longer works. The book also contains a helpful introduction, entitled "A perspective on Hilbert's programs", and a time-line giving a sketch of the major events relating to the Hilbert programs. Each section begins with a one page "Brief guide" that provides an overview of the section's essays. Some of the essays begin with an abstract -- it might be better if they all did. Some lovely photographs of the major historical figures are also scattered throughout the volume.

I would have thought that most people working in contemporary philosophy of mathematics and/or the history of mathematics, logic, and philosophy from that exciting period would already be familiar with at least most of the essays in this volume. Sieg is recognized as a major figure in all of these areas, one whose work is essential reading. Everyone in each of those fields certainly ought to be aware of the themes, in some detail. Nevertheless, it is good to have the essays collected, and good to read (or re-read) them together, for a number of reasons. The ideas and issues developed in the various essays reinforce each other. Most of the essays deal with most of the historical, philosophical, and logical issues, but each one emphasizes some aspects at the expense of others. The reader gets a good feel for the overall unity in Sieg's thinking, and just how the various themes interact.

There is a fair amount of overlap among the essays. Some themes are repeated, several times in some cases. The alternative, I suppose, would be for Sieg to write a perhaps shorter, self-contained monograph. This reader, at least, did not mind the overlap and, at times, found it useful. It is good to have some of the themes repeated, both to serve as reminders and to see how the various themes play out in different contexts.

The essays are divided into four groups. Part I, "Mathematical roots", consists of three essays. The first, "Dedekind's analysis of number: systems and axioms" (co-authored with Dirk Schlimm), traces the background of Richard Dedekind's foundational thinking in the appropriate mathematical and philosophical context, focusing especially on interactions with the major and not-so-major figures. In light of Dedekind's influence on Hilbert, discussed in this and (more fully) in following essays, this serves as a sort of prolegomenon to the themes of the volume. The other two essays, "Methods for real arithmetic" and "Hilbert's programs: 1917-1922", trace the development of Hilbert's thinking before the so-called "Hilbert Program" was articulated. The careful scholarship includes an insightful treatment of Hilbert's work on geometry around the turn of the twentieth century and extends to the early twenties. Sieg provides interesting connections between the evolution in Hilbert's thinking and just about every important figure of the time. Especially relevant is the role of Bernays. There is no central theme in these essays, but one item of note is the development of Hilbert's attitude toward consistency and consistency proofs, especially the transition from the more model-theoretic arguments in the geometry text to the syntactic, proof-theoretic approach that dominated the Program(s) later.

Part II consists of two groups of five essays each. The first group is dubbed "Historical". Its first essay, "Finitist proof theory: 1922-1934", traces the evolution of Hilbert and his school's notion of formalization and proof, right up to when the incompleteness theorems were announced. Again, Sieg makes it clear that the goals and themes of the Program evolved. The next two essays, "After Köningsberg" and "In the shadow of incompleteness: Hilbert and Gentzen" trace the developments of Hilbert and his collaborators in light of incompleteness. We see how Gödel's results were absorbed and digested, and we see how various figures reacted to them. The role of Gentzen's consistency proofs is of particular interest, both for the historical themes and the underlying philosophical issues. The next essay, "Gödel at Zislel's" (co-authored with Charles Parsons) is an Introductory Note to an item in Gödel [1995] that itself consists of notes that Gödel made for a lecture he delivered in Vienna in January 1938. Gödel's own thinking, at the time, on the matter of finitary arithmetic and what remains of the epistemological goals of the Hilbert Programs is illuminated in this essay. The section concludes with "Hilbert and Bernays: 1939", which outlines the contents of the second volume of Grundlagen der Mathematik (mostly attributed to Bernays).

The second half of Part II consists of: "Foundations for analysis and proof theory", "Reductions of theories for analysis", "Hilbert's program sixty years later", "On reverse mathematics", and "Relative consistency and accessible domains". The narrative moves ahead by some forty years and deals with the epistemological significance of proof theory, a field in which Sieg himself has made important contributions. It is emphasized that large parts of classical analysis can be carried out in theories that are conservative extensions of constructive theories. Sieg argues that these results are significant for the epistemology of mathematics. I cannot do better than quote the opening of the last essay in this section:

The goal of Hilbert's program -- to give consistency proofs for analysis and set theory within finitist mathematics -- is unattainable, the program is dead. The mathematical instrument, however, that Hilbert invented for attaining his programmatic aim is remarkably well: proof theory has obtained important results and pursues fascinating logical questions . . . we may ask ourselves whether the results of proof theory are significant for the foundational concerns that motivated Hilbert's program and, more generally, for a reflective examination of the nature of mathematics. (p. 299)

Sieg develops a fascinating contrast between "accessible domains", those whose objects can be construed as mental construction (suitably idealized), and the more usual run of ideal mathematics, based on impredicative definitions and the like. Proof theory sheds considerable light on how these theories interact, and how the former can be seen to ground the latter.

Part III, "Philosophical horizons", consists of: "Aspects of mathematical experience", "Beyond Hilbert's reach?", and "Searching for proofs (and uncovering aspects of the mathematical mind)". It continues the philosophical themes broached in the "accessible domains" paper, suggesting a bold and innovative philosophy of mathematics. The perspective is described in the opening of the abstract for the final essay:

What is it that shapes mathematical arguments into proofs that are intelligible to us, and what is it that allows us to find proofs efficiently? -- This is the informal question I intend to address by investigating, on the one hand, the abstract ways of the axiomatic method in modern mathematics and, on the other hand, the concrete ways of proof construction suggested by modern proof theory. (p. 377)

The theme is to investigate the relationship between introducing mathematical concepts and proving theorems about them.

I think that the primary purpose of a review is to help readers decide whether to obtain and digest the reviewed item. My view on this should be clear. Anyone who has at least a passing interest in the philosophy of mathematics, the relatively recent history of mathematics, mathematical logic (especially proof theory), the growth of ideas in mathematics, or the foundations of mathematics, will find this essential reading. Sieg is a major scholar in all of these areas, and he has shown, throughout his career, how work in any of these areas illuminates all of them.


Davis, M. [1965], The undecidable, Hewlett, New York, The Raven Press.

Gödel, K. [1931], "Über formal unentscheidbare Sätze der Principia Mathematica und verwandter Systeme I", Montatshefte für Mathematik und Physik 38, 173-198; translated as "On formally undecidable propositions of the Principia Mathematica", in Davis [1965], 4-35, and in van Heijenoort [1967], 596-616; also Gödel [1986], 144-195.

Gödel, K. [1934], "On undecidable propositions of formal mathematical systems", in Davis [1965], 39-74; also Gödel [1986], 346-371.

Gödel, K. [1986], Collected works I, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Gödel, K. [1995], Collected works III, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Hilbert, D. [1925], "Über das Unendliche", Mathematische Annalen 95, 161-190; translated as "On the infinite", van Heijenoort [1967], 369-392.

Hilbert, D., and P. Bernays [1939], Grundlagen der Mathematik II, Berlin, Springer.

Tait, W. [1981], "Finitism", The Journal of Philosophy 78, 524-546.

Van Heijenoort, J. [1967], From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879-1931, Cambridge, Massachusetts, Harvard University Press.