Hippocrates' Oath and Asclepius' Snake: The Birth of the Medical Profession

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T. A. Cavanaugh, Hippocrates' Oath and Asclepius' Snake: The Birth of the Medical Profession, Oxford University Press, 2018, 177pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190673673.

Reviewed by Marquis Berrey, University of Iowa


T.A. Cavanaugh aims to recapture the two essential therapeutic aims at the heart of medical practice with the philosophical claim that both beneficence and iatrogenic harm are central to our experience of medical practice. His book about the Hippocratic Oath discusses a set of symbols and professional documents about healing that generate the prescriptive tradition of Western medicine "to help, or not to harm" (Hippocrates, Epidemics 1.11).[1] Cavanaugh's main interest in iatrogenic harm lies with the physician killing the patient. He collects historical and contemporary materials about physicians' involvement in euthanasia, physician-assisted suicide, and capital punishment (elective abortion receives only a passing glance) to argue that (74) "the desire to involve physicians in killing itself has a perennial quality". The cultural impetus for killing by means of a technically proficient medical knowledge creates an ethical problem for medicine as a profession: it suggests to potential patients that healers' aspiration to cure is merely aspirational; it is at odds with a profession dedicated to healing. One of Cavanaugh's goals is to recover a professional code governing the physician's claim to the moral goods internal to medical knowledge. To that end Cavanaugh argues that the Hippocratic Oath provides the needed moral directive because it (4) "establishes boundaries within which ethical medicine takes place." While Cavanaugh offers genuine food for thought in an often charmingly written volume, his effort is likely to cause friends of the Hippocratic Oath to pause. Although addressed to a wide audience at the intersection of multiple disciplines, this is not a book that will satisfy medical ethicists, historians, and physicians equally.

Cavanaugh proceeds chronologically, moving from myth, to ancient history, to modern history, to a contemporary setting. In the first chapter he introduces the paradoxical idea that the wounder can heal and the healer can wound. Evidence includes Euripides' fragmentary play Telephus, in which Achilles uses his spear to wound Telephus and later uses the same spear to heal him on the advice of an oracle. Cavanaugh also draws on the imagery of the snake on Asclepius' staff to illustrate the ambiguity of wounding within the medical tradition. Cavanaugh's philosophical argument divides (18-30) iatrogenic harm into wounds of treatment, errors, and role-conflation. Role-conflation, where physicians intentionally wound their patients, is central to his claims: Cavanaugh gives as examples the ambiguous status of Apollo and Asclepius, both invoked in Oath 1, as healing divinities who can also harm. (I use the section numbering of the Oath in Jouanna 1996, the best current philological edition.) Readers who take ancient myth to give insight into our daily lives will find these claims rewarding; others will wonder whether the ambiguity is truly present in human physicians.

In the second chapter Cavanaugh gives a close reading of the Hippocratic Oath. He guides the Greekless reader through the meaning and grammar of key terms. His interpretations of each individual clause in the Oath are largely accurate, subject to some corrections discussed below. Cavanaugh situates the Oath in the historical context of the disappearance of the teaching-lineages characteristic of Asclepiads who passed their medical knowledge from father to son. A new form of teaching a healing technique arose in its place as a professionalized medicine. Cavanaugh stresses the injustices and harms singled out by the Oath for the profession to avoid (71): "killing patients, sexually relating to individuals encountered in one's practice, and violating confidence".

The third chapter is the meat of the argument. Cavanaugh distinguishes the Hippocratic Oath from viewpoints that condone wounding the patient. He argues that the Hippocratic position allows surgery in our usual sense, differentiating medical wounds from injuries (83): "a medical wound serves the whole's good, while an injury does not." He differentiates two views that condone wounding the patient: the Apollonian physician may injure the patient when thinking it the least harmful outcome for the patient, so that reduction of harm is the object, whereas the Asclepian physician avoids injuring but denies that death constitutes an injury. (Cavanaugh acknowledges (75) his names "may not be entirely compelling".) For example, the Asclepian participates in physician-assisted suicide on the grounds that death is not an injury; the Apollonian participates on the grounds that it minimizes harm (79-80). Cavanaugh argues that committing acts that injure, including killing, are incompatible with the role of caregiver. The Asclepian view is therefore quickly dismissed.

Cavanaugh's most innovative contribution to studies of the Oath is recognizing the foil that the Apollonian physician plays. Against the power of a technically proficient physician to injure on grounds internal to medical thought, the Oath incorporates an ethic joining technical ability to moral life. (The phrase κατὰ γνώμην ἐμήν "according to my opinion" at the end of Oath 2 in Jouanna 1996, absent from the traditional text and hence Cavanaugh's discussion, arguably grounds the physician's subjective view.) Cavanaugh recounts (87-95) the history of Dr. Guillotin, inventor of the eponymous instrument for capital punishment, as an example of the Apollonian physician. Even the contemporary statute North Carolina 15-190, disputed by the state medical board which lost in court, requires a licensed physician or medical professional "to monitor injection of the required lethal substances and certify the fact of the execution." To the Apollonian argument Cavanaugh objects (97) that those being punished are not patients. Carrying his case against the Apollonian argument further, Cavanaugh considers physician-assisted suicide and euthanasia. He makes (101-105) five different objections: it undermines trust placed in physicians; it medicalizes existential, not psychosomatic distress; it jeopardizes the welfare of other vulnerable patients, such as the suicidal; it retards the research progression of medicine; and it invites medical involvement in capital punishment, torture, and war. Cavanaugh concludes by arguing (108-116) that the center of medical professionalism is the avoidance of iatrogenic harm and not, as others have argued, the contrast between egoism and altruism. This will be a controversial claim for readers who have not accepted the entirety of Cavanaugh's argument.

The fourth chapter takes up the purpose of a medical oath. Here is Cavanaugh at his best. He argues (123) that an oath creates a public statement of ethical intent: it is the performative act of belonging to a profession. Since (131) "a professional practice has goods native to itself", a medical oath defines the good internal to medicine and implicates its own professional autonomy. Medicine is not merely a technique but contains its own internal norms (139). Professional autonomy requires that society honor professional conscience. Cavanaugh concludes with both the benefits and problems of pluralism for professional oath-taking. The White Coat Ceremony is valuable for establishing a professional ethos. But if individuals swear their own oaths, ought we not to speak of a multiplicity of medical professions? The book ends with an appendix of a Greek-English edition of the Oath, substantial endnotes, a bibliography, and a full index rerum.

While scholars of all disciplines will recognize Cavanaugh's debt to Aristotelianism in his discussions of Aristotle, Aquinas, and MacIntyre, readers' responses to the volume are likely to fragment along disciplinary lines. Bioethicists skeptical of Hippocratic ethics may concede that a professional oath is necessary but remain unpersuaded that the Hippocratic Oath fits contemporary needs. Some modern critics of the Oath take their departure from it on the basis of the relationship between professional conduct and personal morality. Yet Cavanaugh speaks, like the Oath, only of acts and not of character. That the Oath says nothing about the moral character of the medical practitioner is surprising but consonant with other Hippocratic treatises. Some commentators have supposed that the Oath concerns itself merely with medical etiquette, the rules governing physicians' self-presentation and behavior. Still others argue that, since moral excellence is indeed at stake, the oath-taker must already be a virtuous individual and swear to uphold the virtues of piety, purity, justice, and abstinence. Cavanaugh's role-based analysis of the goods internal to a profession omits any discussion of this topic and avoids addressing contemporary criticisms of the Oath.

The historically minded reader will find greater limitations with language, historical reading strategies, and some methodological argument. Philological interest in the language of the Oath is well-founded. With a vocabulary distinctive among the writings of the Hippocratic Corpus, the Oath is an instance of sophistic rhetoric probably of the fifth or fourth centuries BCE: formed of elaborate ring-structures, built in pairs and tricola, with deliberate archaism and some key terms from the sophistic movement. It alludes to passages of older Greek poets and themes of independent professional competence found in other Hippocratic writings. It is a document of high literary style that demands exegesis. Yet literary skills sometimes go astray here. Cavanaugh's summation (70-71) of the Oath does not reflect the Oath's rhetorical balance, with positive items balancing the negatives that the swearer promises. Jouanna 1996 prints ὀμνύω "I swear" rather than the Ionic dialectical form ὄμνυμι "I swear" in the text of the Oath 1, a point that undermines Cavanaugh's claim (45) to date the text securely to the fifth century BCE. The participle καμνόντων "the sick" with imperfective aspect in the text of the Oath 2 does not include "the dead", against the ambiguity Cavanaugh implies (56, 84); the participle only means "the dead" when used in the aorist aspect (LSJ s.v. κάμνω II.5). Cavanaugh does not make clear (67-68) that σωμάτων "bodies" in Oath 6 is normal Greek for the individual: a σῶμα can be autonomous, as in Thucydides 2.41.1, or the usual term for a slave in later Greek (LSJ s.v. σῶμα II.2). Clarity of this term might help to illuminate the Oath's ethical position relevant for our contemporary interest in patient autonomy (118-119).

Historicizing difficulties appear between our contemporary reading and that of the distant past. Into Oath 2 Cavanaugh misreads (57) humility, a Christian virtue, since the swearer prays for fame among all people forever in Oath 8. Cavanaugh misreads (101) Plutarch's Alexander 19 to claim that "physicians themselves benefit when others know that they foreswear killing a patient", rather than the correct understanding that ancient physicians disclaimed to take on hopeless cases (Hippocrates, Prognostic 1) to avoid throwing their own skills and their art into disrepute. The Oath does not provide the resources for Cavanaugh's claims that medicine is caregiving (85) and that medicine needs research (104), their cogency in a modern context notwithstanding: charity is a historical transformation largely of the Christian and Islamic Middle Ages, and duties to the academic community is a transformation principally of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Cavanaugh recognizes (4) that more than the Oath is needed to establish prescriptive contemporary medical professionalism.

As a matter of interpretative principle, Cavanaugh sometimes gives a maximal argument when a less robust claim will serve his purposes. He does not need to argue (31-43) that the Hippocratic Oath was authored by the historical Hippocrates in order to claim that the Oath carries moral weight. Yet he does so, against all contemporary historical scholarship and despite his acknowledgement of the Hippocratic Question. Equally troubling is Cavanaugh's rejection (64-66) of the entire prohibition against lithotomy in Oath 5 as a later interpolation, following scholarship modernizing the Oath for present use. While it has sometimes been deleted in both ancient and modern rewritings of the Oath, the passage prohibiting lithotomy is transmitted in every manuscript tradition of the Oath. Its absence would violate the tricolon of regimen, drugs, and surgery that the Oath advances, the tripartite division of therapy so characteristic of Hippocratic medicine. Scholarship elucidating historical authorial intent, such as Cavanaugh's, cannot delete transmitted passages merely on the grounds of their difficulty. Despite the known interpretative challenges of Oath 5, Cavanaugh might have followed German commentators in both stressing οὐ τεμέω "I will not cut", which enunciates a distinction between making a wound and treating an existing wound (Celsus 7.pr.5), and in emphasizing the putative lower social status of ἐργάτῃσιν ἀνδράσι πρήξιος τῆσδε "workmen practicing that business". These interpretative paths would better accord with his claim (78) "that Hippocratic (or exclusively therapeutic) medicine does not necessarily exclude wounding and wounds, while it does necessarily exclude injuring-wounds and injuries."

Physicians and other disciplinary proponents of professional medical autonomy will sympathize with much of Cavanaugh's final chapter. Yet the politics of medical professionalism in which the Oath has a central place could play out differently. Although Cavanaugh idealizes a world where the internal goods of medicine shape practitioners' professional conscience (145-146), Scribonius Largus, an ancient follower of Hippocrates (122-123), offered a distinction that Cavanaugh rejects: "For that reason [sc. that diseases are detested] these [sc. pity and kindness] prevent a physician who lawfully is bound by the oath of medicine from giving to the enemy a harmful drug (but he will attack them when circumstance demands, as a soldier and good citizen in every way)". Scribonius Largus Compositiones epi.ded.4 found no tension between the internal goods of medicine and the participatory citizenship demanded by the Roman Empire. It is not difficult to imagine a modern Hippocrates making similar claims about the lack of tension between the internal goods of medicine and the participatory citizenship demanded by the contemporary American state, a distinction echoed in the judgment of the North Carolina court (98) that physicians must be present to certify executions. Cavanaugh is right that the Hippocratic Oath inaugurates a tradition of beneficence and nonmaleficence in Western medicine. One hopes that the tradition still has relevance in transitioning from the disciplinary stakes of history to present medical practice. But as Cavanaugh's concerns and the North Carolina court make clear, the question of how to practice that tradition seems no longer to remain solely in the hands of healers.


Jouanna, J. 1996. "Un témoin méconnu da la tradition hippocratique: l'Ambrosianus gr. 134 (B113 sup.), fol. 1-2 (avec une nouvelle édition du Serment et de la Loi)" in A. Garyza (ed.). Histoire et ecdotique des textes médicaux grecs: Atti del II Convegno Internazionale, Parigi 24-26 maggio 1994. Napoli. 253-272.

Lichtenthaeler, C. 1984. Der Eid des Hippokrates: Ursprung und Bedeutung. Köln.

von Staden, H. 2007. "'The Oath', the Oaths, and the Hippocratic Corpus" in V. Boudon-Millot, A. Guardasole, and C. Magdalaine (eds.). La science médicale antique: nouveaux regards; études réunies en l'honneur de Jacques Jouanna. Paris. 425-466.

[1] The Hippocratic ethical adage is widely known in its rhetorically inverted and truncated Latin form as primum non nocere "first, do no harm". Readers dissatisfied with Cavanaugh's discussion (158.n10) of its obscure origin ought to consult Jouanna, J., avec la collaboration de A. Anastassiou et A. Guardasole. 2016. Hippocrate: Épidemies I et III. Les Belles Lettres. Paris. CXVII.n143, who identify an ancient precedent of the Latin phrase in Lactantius Epitome Divinarum Institutionum 55 (60): primum est enim non nocere, proximum prodesse "For the first thing is not to harm, the next thing is to help".