Historical Ontology

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Hacking, Ian, Historical Ontology, Harvard University Press, 2002, 279pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 067400616X.

Reviewed by David Hyder , University of Konstanz


Ian Hacking’s newest book is many things at once: an anthology of occasional pieces, a reflection on the uses of history in philosophy, a treatment of the work of Michel Foucault, a contraction and extension of ideas in Hacking’s earlier work. Although some of the pieces (“Dreams in Place”, “Wittgenstein as Philosophical Psychologist”) lie apart from the main lines of the collection, the bulk of them combine to form an invaluable overview of Hacking’s philosophy, above all of the twin strands of traditional conceptual analysis and Foucaultian historicism running through his work. The essays are written in a clear and straightforward style, although the varied genres (including popular reviews, lectures for specialists, as well as academic articles) do put varying demands on the reader’s knowledge.

In the previously unpublished introduction, also titled “Historical Ontology”, Hacking considers what such a discipline might be, both by explaining how Foucault’s and his writings exemplify it, and by distinguishing it from its cousins, “historical epistemology” and “historical meta-epistemology”, as well as from more august kin, such as “history”, “ontology”, and “epistemology” tout court. This chapter, like Foucault’s Archaeology of Knowledge, is something of a conceit: the science of historical ontology is identified in the author’s work retrospectively, and one is not quite sure if he truly wants there to be such a thing in the future (“my wish list in philosophy would barely mention a desire for advance in historical ontology” p. 25). Are we perhaps dealing with a nonce-word?

The answer is a qualified no. The term is intended to replace, or to subsume, a series of methods that Hacking inaugurated in his 1974 lecture, “One Way to do Philosophy”(not in this collection), which he describes in the second essay (“Five Parables”) as representing his “historic-linguistic turn”. The basic premise, which Hacking now rejects, was that philosophy aims to solve philosophical problems, and that since these problems are conceptual in nature, philosophy is essentially concerned with concepts. Thus far, the ante is just that of Cambridge conceptual analysis in the tradition of Braithwaite and Wittgenstein. The historical turn follows from two further claims: concepts are to be identified with the conditions licensing the use of particular words; but there can be rifts in the development of our knowledge that occlude the original conditions on proper use. It follows that present concepts (present conditions on the use of words) may retain traces of their origins, for we may no longer remember why we first insisted that words be used in just this way, and therefore that, “Some of our philosophical problems about concepts are the result of their history” (p.37). Some problems, for instance the problem of induction, can be seen to derive from forgotten assumptions, for instance from the notion of a particulate fact.

If Hacking now rejects some premises of this argument—above all the assumption that philosophy is about problems—he pursues the line of investigation they occasioned in a series of more recent chapters concerned with what he, drawing on the work of A.C. Crombie, calls “styles of reasoning” (“’Style’ for Historians and Philosophers”, “Language, Truth, and Reason”). In these two articles, which are the most strongly argued of the collection, Hacking advocates a relativist conception of reason that is neither subjective nor constructivist. Many statements, he allows, including “the maligned category of observation sentences”, are largely independent of any given method of proof. But a large part of our language, above all that expressing our scientific knowledge, acquired determinate meaning hand in hand with specific styles of demonstration—those experimental, axiomatic, analogical-comparative techniques (to name a few) that characterize the development of Western science. These styles of reasoning determine what counts as a candidate for truth-and-falsity in a given period. In determining a space of possibilities, styles of reasoning relativize what is knowable. But it is not the panoply of styles that determines what is true—neither truth nor rationality depend on our subjective whim. Hacking concedes that he is arguing for a species of conceptual scheme; however, he contends that his notion is immune to the usual Davidsonian critique. The latter interprets conceptual schemes as sets of true sentences, and argues from the indeterminacy of translation to the conclusion that the notion is incoherent. Hacking counters that neither the notion of incommensurable schemes nor that of radical mistranslation (“Was There Ever a Radical Mistranslation?”) is well-founded. Furthermore, Hacking’s schemes are not constituted by sets of true statements—”A style is not a scheme that confronts reality” (p. 175). Such a style is rather to be conceived as a Comtian “positivity”, or a Foucaultian “discourse”. It is a set of techniques, which can be both linguistic and material, that make statements candidates for truth in the first place.

The fit between what Hacking first envisaged in the 1970s and Foucault’s work is no accident—his program is no doubt to some extent a deliberate translation of Foucault’s methodology into analytic terms. Hacking’s understanding of Foucault’s work is outlined here in two chapters (“The Archaeology of Michel Foucault”, “Michel Foucault’s Immature Science”), both of which will be useful mainly to new readers of Foucault, in that they presume little or no familiarity with his work. These essays do, however, make evident to what extent Hacking’s rejection of his earlier language-oriented analysis parallels Foucault’s increasing distance from his early work and its summa, the Archaeology of Knowledge. For both authors, that shift can very well be understood as a shift from epistemology—a shift impelled by their dissatisfaction with idealist remnants in their thought—to ontology (for Foucault, from “critical” to “genealogical” investigations). Hacking identifies the problem, or at least his version of it, as “verbalism”: the doctrine that language is the primary object of our philosophical investigations. Such a doctrine has generally been coupled to a weak transcendentalism: it is not just language, but conditions on the significant use thereof that the philosopher investigates.

In Foucault’s best-known works, The Order of Things and The Archaeology of Knowledge, this linguistic transcendentalism is plain to see. Foucault maintains that earlier systems of knowledge, which he terms “discourses” in order to underline his rejection of idea-based semantics, are subject to large-scale structural constraints. These “historical a prioris” cut across the boundaries of scientific disciplines, ordering the space of statements that are possible in a given science in a given age. And the historical epistemology that Foucault adopts from the earlier work of Bachelard, Cavaillès and Canguilhem will reveal how these forgotten systems of reasoning impinge on today’s scientific discourse. It is because only certain things can be said in a given age that one feels permitted to say things like “X was not constituted as an object of knowledge at time t”, or more simply “X did not exist at time t”. For, following Quine, there were no variables to bind X to at t, and thus no sense in which X existed then either. The fundamental categories of the language at t prescribe the order of things at that point in history—they determine both its metaphysics and its logic, as categories always have.

But such a line of reasoning conflicts directly with our realist intuitions. Taken to an extreme, it leads to a philosophy which, while internally coherent, can never explain how changes in category-systems could ever occur. Foucault’s move from critical to genealogical investigations, which address the material and social conditions for the emergence of different kinds of objects, no doubt reflects his dissatisfaction with his earlier approach. Hacking’s thinking bifurcates at this point as well: the critical intuition is developed further in the work on styles of reasoning; whereas the strong, ontological version is preserved in what he calls “dynamic nominalism”, even though the latter holds only for a restricted domain.

What is repugnant in strict nominalism is the idea that inanimate things respond to our categories, that their behavior could be significantly influenced by what we say about them. But, Hacking concedes, “In natural science, our invention of categories does not ’really’ change the way the world works” (p. 40). The matter is different when it comes to people (“Making Up People”), and it is this interaction between systems of classification and the people they classify which, he tentatively suggests, distinguishes the human from the natural sciences. The point is made here again in terms both analytic and continental. If intentional action is, in Anscombe’s language, action under a description, then the emergence of new categories in the human sciences (psychic trauma, the phases of child development, hysteria, multiple personality disorder) changes the space of possible action. Following Sartre, one can say that changes in these categories do indeed change the ways of being that are open to individuals.

One detects a curious reluctance on Hacking’s part at this juncture. For the interest of an historical ontology lies presumably in its going past mere verbal transcendentalism, in its investigating the creation not just of new ways of talking or thinking, but indeed of new ways of being. In the domain of the human sciences, the emergence of scientific objects is irrefutable: new classifications of mental disorders, new treatments and institutions extend not only the space of talk, but indeed that of existence. By contrast, in considering his own work on the creation of phenomena in the laboratory as a candidate for historical ontology, Hacking denies it membership, because it does not “mesh with [the Foucaultian] axes of knowledge, power, and ethics” (p. 16). This explanation seems insufficient, if not inconsistent. For if these axes confine the project to the human sciences, then its scope is other than elsewhere advertised: “My historical ontology is concerned with objects or their effects which do not exist in any recognizable form until they are objects of scientific study” (p. 11). Surely there is room here for non-human phenomena created in the laboratory?

The point is not to quibble about definitions—Hacking does remind us that his introduction of the term is partly playful. And it is he, after all, who cautions us in “Making Up People” against too quickly drawing a line between the human and natural sciences by appealing to the interaction, or lack thereof, of concepts and their objects. His reservation there is, I take it, the same one that underlies his equivocal use of the term “historical ontology”. If we had a clear notion of what such interaction consisted in, then we could use it to distinguish between natural and artificial orders, and thus also between the natural and human sciences. But it is evidently true that, to the extent that science is used to change the world, most scientific concepts do “interact” with their objects. Nor will it do to say: “They interact, but the objects do not cognize the concepts.” For the concepts that change the ways of being of human actors also do not need to be cognized by them in order to change their ways of being. I surmise, though Hacking does not say it outright, that he envisages a continuum of interactions: at the one extreme are natural kinds completely distinct from our descriptions, and at the other we have kinds that are purely artificial. To know where a scientific concept falls on this line, we must “look and see”, as he repeatedly admonishes. It is in the detail of such investigations that the exclusive disjunctions between real and nominal, natural and social will lose their grip on us. This moral will no doubt frustrate those philosophers impatient of such deliberate, Wittgensteinian ambiguity. Others will, however, be cheered by Hacking’s approach in these pieces. The game here is “to lose ourselves, as befits philosophy, in total complexity, and then escape from it by craft and skills and, among other things, philosophical reflection”(p. 17).