Historical Redress: Must We Pay for the Past?

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Richard Vernon, Historical Redress: Must We Pay for the Past?, Continuum, 177pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441121318.

Reviewed by Nahshon Perez, Bar Ilan University


Richard Vernon’s new book is a welcome addition to the political theory literature that concerns the important question whether past wrongs should be redressed. The main thrust of the book is a gentle yet consistent skepticism towards attempts to justify such redress. It is published as a part of the Think Now series by Continuum, and is therefore written for the non-expert. It progresses very gradually, and perhaps too gradually for this reader who was asked to review this book after publishing a book on the same topic with a similar skeptical (yet more radical) view of redressing past wrongs.[1]

While the skepticism towards such redress is welcome as a counterweight to the majority of books and articles in the field arguing for redress, and the 'lay person' approach is inviting and easygoing, there are some important omissions and some mistakes in the book. It is unfair to judge it as one would judge an article in Philosophy and Public Affairs, given the different goal, but even taking into account the venue, perhaps more precision and attention to details could be expected. This comment does not mean that the book does not have merit -- as I noted above, it offers an important improvement over much of the existing pro-redress literature.

Historical Redress is divided to five substantive chapters, each one dedicated to one particular aspect of the debate regarding the justifiability of historical redress. The first chapter deals with the general problem of past wrongs, that is, how is it that deceased people have rights or interests that survive them. The second chapter focuses on the 'who benefits?' question -- that is, whether past wrongs yield unjust enrichment for later generations, and what should be done with this enrichment. The third chapter deals with memory, and why remembering past wrongs might be important -- and here redress becomes an instrument of memory, not the other way around (more on this below). The fourth chapter examines the argument for redress relying on identity: redress here reaffirms a given democratic identity of a state or a nation, regardless of issues of responsibility or benefit. The fifth chapter argues for a 'right to clarity', i.e., in having a clear understanding of the society in which we live, and to transfer this identity for the betterment for future generations.

In this review, I would like to focus on one argument that Vernon ultimately qualifies and perhaps even rejects: the one from memory. The changes or qualifications Vernon introduces to the argument from memory lead to the two pro-redress arguments that he seems to accept: the argument regarding forward looking reasons for redress, and the argument, stressed in chapter five and in the conclusion on the right to clarity, which can be referred to as the argument from identity of the nation or state that in its past committed a given wrong, and then decides to redress this wrong as a part of a wider transformation of a given societyBy that act, the nation or state demonstrates a complete break with a troubled, unjust history while acknowledging the wrongdoing in its past (p. 142). These are not the only arguments Vernon makes, but they seem to be the heart of his project, and unlike other arguments (say, unjust enrichment), they have not been widely discussed in the relevant literature.

Let us begin with the argument regarding memory (chapter 3). Vernon distinguishes between personal or private memory, and public or collective memory. The former is what resides in the memory of an individual, say, whatever happened to you in primary school. The latter is what a society as a whole, using statist instruments such as education, memorials, and public apologies, chooses to pass to children (mainly), adults, and (most importantly) to transform from a historical fact to a part of the national identity. This latter choice is what interests Vernon (and rightly so).

Suppose a given state or a nation had committed a wrong in the past -- should that wrong be part of the national memory, and why? Vernon briefly mentions the danger of too much memory (p. 65), though, in my view, perhaps too quickly. As Renan famously wrote, there are cases in which forgetting is a better choice,[2] and perhaps it would have been worth considering Jean Amery’s short masterpiece 'Resentments' here.[3] In any case, Vernon tries to find an answer to the question of why a given society should remember a past wrong it committed. Vernon mentions two options: historical facts, selected for their importance, and historical episodes chosen for their usefulness, a moralizing history so to speak. He rightly stresses that it is difficult to choose between the two options, but once the latter is chosen, historical truth quickly disappears from the stage. Regardless of the final decision, Vernon stresses that whatever choice is made, it shapes the national identity. In this, I think, he is closer to the moralizing version than the dry historical version.

This distinction, and the function a memory has to fill, leads the rest of this chapter, including the rationale for public apologies. The goal of public memory and public apologies therefore should be forward looking, as a way to fill several functions, e.g., reconciliation, education, and signaling changes in identity. This is perhaps a step forward in the proper understanding of apologies and national memory (for example, the 'sincerity condition' of apologies in private behavior is rightly rejected in public/national ones). But the move leaves this reader with a peculiar humpty-dumpty feeling. This forward looking perspective transforms the meaning of terms used ('memory' and 'apology') in a profound way -- perhaps simply using the term 'forward looking policies' would be better. Furthermore, if forward-looking considerations are the decisive factor, it is not clear to me that memory and/or apologies are the best measures. Reparations might serve better to improve relations between groups in some cases, for example.

Moving forward, is it possible to play with national memory in this day and age? Haven’t the days of 'noble lies' passed? How would you control the venues of alternative information? Moving forward, while Vernon mentions the case of deeply divided societies and the difficulties in creating a joined national narrative for such nations, it goes back to the problem of the collectivist assumptions of the vast majority of the redress literature. Vernon manages to escape some of it, but perhaps a measure of collectivism sneaks back in through the back door (more on this below).

Lastly, there are some important mistakes, both factual and conceptual, in Vernon’s discussion of Eichmann’s trial and the reparations Israel received from Germany (pp. 75, 80). Vernon repeats the old view that Eichmann’s work was banal and there was nothing extraordinary about him, but this view has been refuted by historical research[4] (rather than a philosophical intuition looking for an example on which Vernon relies). Furthermore, Vernon confuses the state of Israel, the 'claims conference', the rights of Holocaust survivors to compensation for bodily harms and property lost, the cost of absorbing Holocaust survivors, and reparations paid to Jews residing outside of Israel. He does not distinguish the substantial amounts (over time -- NOT per month) paid to survivors and the rather meager amount paid to the state of Israel. Thus he reaches the wrong conclusion that the reparations were justified as they signaled to the world and to the German population that the transformation of Western Germany was completed. This is objectionable; the reparations were, in essence, the annulation of funds unjustly held by Germans, the return of property held by Jews before 1933, and compensation for bodily harm. And unlike what the book indicates, the sums paid to Israel were NOT very substantial (p. 80). This is a sensitive topic on which there is substantial literature,[5] and Vernon should correct these points in future editions. These points are not just a correction of a mistaken description of a sensitive set of events; they also bear a philosophical lesson: reparations paid to survivors (not descendants of survivors) are not only about the transformation of the identity of the collective payer, but first and foremost respecting the rights of the survivors.

This brings me to the last chapter and the conclusion. Much of what Vernon finds attractive in redress is based on the idea of collective identity (i.e., that redress is a part of a national transformation from past X to better present Y; redress here is a signal, so to speak), and is forward looking. Hw rightly dismisses many of the well-known arguments for redress offered by various scholars (collective responsibility, national shame and pride, etc.). How successful are the two remaining arguments? With regard to transformation of one’s society, I would argue that transformation is most probably a by-product of just policies, not a policy one can directly point to. If a given country does the right things (for example, pays reparations to survivors, establishes a democratic regime, respects rights), an external spectator (preferably) can one day look at it and say: 'I don’t recognize this place'. I am not sure if one can directly aim for this goal.  Here I think of the mother in Heinrich Böll’s famous novel,The Clown, who instantly transforms herself from a Nazi into the president of the executive committee of the society for the reconciliation of racial differences. Not the best example perhaps, but neither is aiming directly at transformation. To put things clearly, one should pay reparations because it is a demand of justice -- say, nullifying unjust enrichment, not because it says something about how one is transformed from previous (bad) X to present (better) Y.

Let us move on to the forward-looking aspect. Here, Vernon, like Leif Wenar,[6] argues that redress might be justified following forward-looking reasons. But while Wenar emphasizes reconciliation between two adversaries, Vernon emphasizes the self-transforming, educational aspects of redress. That’s a reasonable view (noting the reservations explained in the previous paragraph). I would be curious to see, however, what happens once citizens of a country, who understood Vernon’s and others' arguments against collective responsibility, receive the news that they owe reparations or an apology to a set of people to whom they have done nothing wrong. It is not trivial to reconcile the individualistic view of responsibility with the collectivist view of reparations for the future.

Lastly, a word about the non-identity problem, which is not analyzed in the book at all. The non-identity problem, famously raised by Derek Parfit and often examined in the context of redressing past wrongs, goes roughly as follows: if living is (usually) better than non-living, and if a given historical injustice is causally connected to the existence of the descendants of deceased victims, how can a living person be wronged by something without which s/he would not exist?[7] Surely the historical injustice improved her/his situation (or at least did not harm him/her). This is not the place for an elaborated examination of this problem (I tried to do so elsewhere[8]), but the non-identity problem has undeniably important repercussions for the entire debate on redress, especially once the original victims have died. This is a puzzling omission, and it is not clear to me reader why Vernon choose to omit a discussion on this important topic.

To conclude, Vernon does a valuable service to the non-initiated reader interested in the topic of redressing past wrongs. Especially valuable is his gentle yet precise and persistent rejection of many collective based arguments for redress. Perhaps it will help in changing the very unbalanced situation that exists in the literature on redress, in which the pro-redress publications enjoy an unhealthy monopoly.

[1] N. Perez, Freedom from Past Injustices (Edinburgh University Press, 2012).

[2] E. Renan, “What is a Nation”, in Becoming National, G. Eley and R. G. Suny (eds.), (Oxford: Oxford University Press,1996), pp. 42-56, at p. 49.

[3] J. Amery, “Resentments”, in At the Mind’s Limits, (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1980), pp. 62-81.

[4] H. Yablonka, The State of Israel vs. Adolph Eichmann (Schocken, 2004); J. Robinson, And the Crooked Shall Be Made Straight: The Eichmann Trial, the Jewish Catastrophe, and Hannah Arendt's Narrative. (Jewish Publication Society, 1965).

[5] R. Zweig, German Reparations and the Jewish World: A History of the Claims Conference (Routledge, 2001); M. Bazyler, Holocaust Justice (NYU Press, 2003).

[6] L. Wenar, “Reparations for the Future”, Journal of Social Philosophy, Vol. 37 (3), 2006, pp. 396-405.

[7] D. Parfit, Reasons and Persons (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986), pp. 351-355; C. Morris, “Existential Limits to the Rectification of Past Wrongs”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 21 (2), 1984, pp. 175-182.

[8] N. Perez, Freedom from Past Injustices (Edinburgh University Press 2012), chapter 2; N. Perez, “Must We Provide Material Redress for Past Wrongs?”, in Contemporary Debates in Applied Ethics, 2nd edition, A. I. Cohen and C. H. Wellman (eds.), Blackwell, 2013, pp. 203-216.