History and Becoming: Deleuze's Philosophy of Creativity

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Craig Lundy, History and Becoming: Deleuze's Philosophy of Creativity, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 216pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748645305.

Reviewed by Henry Somers-Hall, Royal Holloway, University of London


Deleuze makes clear that one of his most important philosophical distinctions is between the process of becoming and that of history. In the Logic of Sense, for instance, it is the science of geography that Deleuze introduces when elaborating his account of temporality, thus emphasising the difference between history and becoming. On a first reading, it would seem to be the case that those aspects of Deleuze's philosophy that are most Deleuzian (the emphasis on creativity, the metaphysics of intensity, the repudiation of common sense) all revolve around the pole of becoming rather than history. As Deleuze notes, 'becoming isn't a part of history; history amounts only [to] the set of preconditions, however recent, that one leaves behind in order to "become", that is, to create something new.'

Now, in spite of the apparent rigidity of this distinction, there have been attempts to rethink the notion of history in line with Deleuze's work, such as Jay Lampert's Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy of History (London: Continuum, 2006). What is novel about Lundy's approach is that rather than attempting to develop a philosophy of history in terms of Deleuze's category of becoming, Lundy argues that the binary opposition of history and becoming is itself misleading, and against the true spirit of Deleuze's work. As Lundy further notes, Deleuze's criticisms of history are more properly directed towards historicism as it is found in the historical tradition prior to Deleuze. We can see Lundy's project then as applying the Deleuzian critique of thinking in terms of oppositions to the thought of Deleuze and Guattari itself. Whereas Deleuze makes a sharp distinction between history and becoming, Lundy argues that history has to be seen as operating in the 'diagonal' between historicism and becoming. Now, such an argument can only be sustained by careful and close readings of some of the central arguments of Deleuze's opus. Before discussing whether Lundy's argument is successful, I want to give a brief overview of the areas of Deleuze's philosophy where Lundy seeks out the materials to construct his argument.

The first chapter of History and Becoming provides an insightful exposition of Deleuze's discussion of thermodynamics in Difference and Repetition, before using Deleuze's analysis to clarify the relationship between two kinds of history. As Lundy notes, Deleuze is very critical of the classical model of thermodynamics. The primary reason for this is that it operates against the horizon of a future that is fully determined (the eventual heat death of the universe caused by the inevitable increase in entropy). Lundy follows DeLanda in recognising the compatibility of modern far-from-equilibrium physics and Deleuze's philosophy of intensity in providing a model of a quasi-open future. Lundy draws on the analyses of Braudel and Peguy, in order to show how we might conceive of an intensive notion of history. None of these themes has been explored in a great deal of detail in the secondary literature, and so are in themselves valuable contributions to the field. Lundy is right, I think, to suggest that an analogy can be drawn between the move from classical to modern thermodynamics, and a similar potential advance for history.

Chapter two extends the analysis provided in chapter one by introducing Deleuze's analysis from the Logic of Sense. Lundy sets out clearly Deleuze's distinction between surface and depth, exploring the interrelation between historicism and becoming, before arguing that history has to be seen neither as one nor the other, but rather as the 'diagonalisation' of the two, or the movement between the two structures. Lundy draws on Deleuze's introduction of the figure of Hercules in the 18th series as a figure fighting a 'dual battle' against Apolline height and Dionysiac depth. As Lundy notes, Deleuze's emphasis here is on the movement between the planes of actuality and virtuality, rather than on each of the planes themselves.

The third chapter tackles Deleuze and Guattari's claim that history is always written in the name of a unitary state apparatus, a claim which seems to rule out anything like a Deleuzoguattarian positive theory of history. While history is clearly associated with the sedentary state in Deleuze and Guattari's dualism of the sedentary and the nomadic, Lundy argues that this dualism itself has to be seen as a tactical introduction on Deleuze and Guattari's part. As they write in a different context, 'we invoke one dualism only in order to challenge another.' To undermine a simplistic reading of the distinction between the smooth and striated, Lundy focuses on the machinic phylum, the movement between the two. Lundy argues that we have to move beyond a simplistic view of the smooth giving rise to the striated, or the striated capturing the smooth. Rather, other more complex relations are possible, such as the capture of the smooth -- as smooth -- by the striated. Lundy replaces the dualism of A Thousand Plateaus with a tripartite schema, with the machinic phylum governing the relationship between the other two.

Chapter four deals with the question of capitalism as retrospectively creating a history of itself. Lundy here draws on Althusser's structuralist Marxism to develop an account of social machines in terms of their creativity and contingency. Lundy's claim, once again, is that the origin of the state cannot be understood in terms of virtuality or actuality, but rather in the interplay of the two. In particular, Lundy delineates three different ways in which we can understand contingency to allow us to develop an understanding of a contingent universal history.

The final chapter turns to Deleuze and Guattari's What is Philosophy? The chapter focuses on the notion of the history of philosophy in two respects. First: how do we understand the historical development of the philosophical tradition? While Deleuze and Guattari emphasise the coexistence of concepts on planes of consistency, there is still a role for history in illuminating the movement between conceptual planes, provided history is not understood as brute historicism. Thus, the history of philosophy can be understood as the exploration of the relationships between conceptual planes. Second, Lundy notes that regardless of whether there is a necessary structure to philosophy, its origins are to be found in a contingent moment: an encounter that relates friendship, opinion and immanence. This leads to a second 'stratigraphic' understanding of history -- the tracing out of connections between disparate states of affairs based on similar events.

The result of the book is therefore the claim that throughout Deleuze's own work, and within his collaborations with Guattari, Deleuze emphasises the importance of the transitions between the various poles of dualisms he develops. As such, history itself cannot be equated with the simplistic conception developed by historicism, but neither can it be understood simply as intensity understood apart from the world of actual states of affairs. Rather history is the process of interchange between these two poles.

In assessing Lundy's argument, we need to separate two questions. The first is, does Deleuze develop a philosophy of history? The second, does Deleuze's philosophy contain the resources to explain historical events? The first question can be answered fairly straightforwardly. Throughout the works of Deleuze, and Deleuze and Guattari, Lundy notes that history is at best seen as a derivative mode of becoming. For Deleuze, history captures those aspects of extensity, linearity, and actuality that are representative of a tradition that obscures difference. Even when Deleuze takes up the work of historians, he does so to assimilate them to other disciplines.

The failure to establish Deleuze's philosophy of history does not rule out a Deleuzian philosophy of history, however. Whilst Deleuze and Guattari develop a philosophy of the event in opposition to their conception of history, understanding the nature of the event entails explicating those aspects of experience that would normally fall under the domain of history. Writing of two of Deleuze's sources for his philosophy of the event, Lundy writes, 'whereas for Peguy and Braudel the reassembling of (and placing oneself within) the event was a way of practising and understanding history, for Deleuze and Guattari, this alternative method is directly positioned against history and renamed "becoming"' (14) Lundy's project in History and Becoming can be seen as drawing out these elements of Deleuze's philosophy that can be used to explain historical events, and to construct a Deleuzian theory of history that overcomes the limitations of Deleuze and Guattari's own narrow conception of it. In this respect, Lundy's project has resonances with Deleuze's own project in the cinema books of showing the affinities between Bergson's metaphysics and film in spite of Bergson's own claims to the contrary. Lundy's approach is, I think, the right one to take, disregarding Deleuze's notion of history, and instead seeing what can be drawn out of Deleuze's philosophy. In showing that such a theory can be drawn out, Lundy provides a wealth of textual evidence to support his formulation of a Deleuzian conception of history.

It would be hard to argue that Deleuze and Guattari see themselves as developing a philosophy of history, and their characterisation of their project as 'geophilosophy' attests to a conscious effort on their part to distance themselves from the philosophical movements of historicism, notably those of Hegel and Heidegger. Nonetheless, Lundy does an impressive job of drawing together a range of material from across Deleuze and Deleuze and Guattari's work to develop his own account. Many of these analyses, such as the account of the intensive, and the material on the somewhat sidelined Logic of Sense are valuable in their own right, aside from the role they play in the overall argument. There are, however, some criticisms we could raise of the book. First, while Lundy does an excellent job of showing how Deleuze provides the materials for the development of a historical science, some analysis of why Deleuze appears so hostile to historicism would have been helpful. There are few references to Hegel or Heidegger in the book. Whilst these are not strictly necessary to the project, they would allow us to see why Deleuze opposes the traditional conception of history quite so vehemently. Along these lines, we might also question whether Heidegger's historicism can be reduced to the kind of causal-linear account that Deleuze takes aim at.

Second, the range of texts employed in the account occlude questions of Deleuze's own philosophical development. Lundy does not address the question of continuity between Deleuze's sole authored works and his collaborations with Guattari. While this is often the case in literature on Deleuze, it seems somewhat more pertinent in this case. Deleuze's early works, such as Difference and Repetition, bear the influence of structuralism, and this has a central role in his conception of what a science might be. In Difference and Repetition, while Deleuze recognises the place of intensity and the process of actualisation in the determination of actual states of affairs, he appears to follow Althusser in arguing that our thought of the event is governed by its Idea, a purely virtual structure. Thus, while history as process is constituted by the move back and forth between actuality and virtuality, history as the study of this process would operate purely in terms of the virtual itself. Deleuze is himself critical of this early approach that too easily inverts Plato while retaining the dichotomy of being and becoming, and Lundy's approach is perhaps better suited to the later works where, under the influence of Guattari, Deleuze attempts to break free from this structuralist tradition. These limitations are minor, however, and Lundy's book provides a fresh and innovative understanding of the nature of history, as well as many admirable insights and clarifications of Deleuze's own philosophy.