History and Freedom: Lectures 1964-1965

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Theodor W. Adorno, History and Freedom: Lectures 1964-1965, Polity Press, 2006, 272pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745630137.

Reviewed by David Ingram, Loyola University Chicago


As a student-activist during the Vietnam War my first introduction to Adorno and Critical Theory came by way of my philosophical apprenticeship under Herbert Marcuse, whose work I studied assiduously, despite his own modest advice directing me to read classical figures in the philosophy of history, notably Aristotle, Kant, and Hegel, with an occasional nod to contemporary figures, including Sartre (who was still much in vogue) and several of his own former colleagues, uppermost being Adorno.  At the time this advice was given I was too ignorant of Adorno's life and thought to appreciate fully the irony of Marcuse's gesture.  Marcuse had been embraced as the guru of the very student movement that had scorned Adorno for allegedly being a mere academic pedant who was afraid to commit himself wholeheartedly to the revolutionary task of building a new emancipated society.  As is well known, Adorno's last course on dialectical thinking, which he began in the summer semester of 1969, never progressed beyond a few lectures to its central theme due to frequent interruptions by students in attendance.  That's a shame, because the theme in question -- the classical Marxian theme concerning the relationship between theory and practice and specifically the relationship between history (and philosophy of history) and revolutionary practice -- was obviously pertinent to their concerns.  Yet one need go no further than the lecture series on history and freedom delivered in 1964-1965 to discern the core of Adorno's argument on this topic -- a topic that emerged with considerable urgency in Adornos' thought as early as 1932, when he taught a course on Lessing's Education of the Human Race with Paul Tillich, who also directed his second dissertation, and continued up until his last writings, 'On Subject and Object' and 'Marginalia to Theory and Practice,' both of which contain material that doubtless would have been included in that last lecture series.

As is apparent from reading the 1964-65 lectures, Adorno subscribed to Marx's own radically revisionary view that the series of events we call 'history' and above all 'human progress' is really pre-history (or a kind of natural history) given over to a seemingly fated mythic cycle of human conflict, crisis, and 'permanent catastrophe' (as Benjamin put it).  For Marx, true history begins only when humanity breaks with its irrational prehistory and learns to act collectively and freely -- and that means with full historical consciousness of its past and future.  Of course, this last thought -- the need to develop historical consciousness in order to become fully free and human -- today seems rather quaint by the eyes of contemporary postmodernists for whom there was never a history to be conscious of.  These lectures therefore stand as a kind of rebuke to certain postmodernists who hastily enlist Adorno into their own ranks.

It also stands against every Hegelian tendency, Right or Left, to invoke a totalizing historical consciousness in support of the status quo.  As Adorno makes clear at several points, there was and is in every society an 'objective possibility' to order human relations along different, non-hierarchical principles.  Admittedly this utopian thought of a free and reconciled humanity finds little support in history.  That is why Adorno himself conceded that the "infinitely weak point" of any critical theory is its essential lack of reasoned arguments and empirical evidence (p. 47).  Be that as it may, we are reminded by Adorno that this utopian thought is the only thought that stands between us and a theodicy of post-histoire that affirms the current way of the world as a final and inevitable resolution, despite its terrible costs.

It is impossible in a review of this sort to encapsulate twenty-eight lectures covering such a broad expanse of themes and arguments and touching on virtually all aspects of modern society and the human condition.  I will therefore limit myself to a somewhat impressionistic rendering of the volume as a whole.  These lectures -- the second of four courses (or 'fragments' of courses, as Adorno refers to them here) whose polemics later found their way into Negative Dialectics (1966) and in the case of the course presently before us, specifically in those chapters dealing with Kant and Hegel -- are based on tape recordings (now lost) that were immediately transcribed at the Institute for Social Research after each lecture.  Rolf Tiedemann, the editor of Adorno's Collected Works for Suhrkamp and the director of the Adorno Archives in Frankfurt, informs us that he edited the transcripts by inserting punctuation and correcting for occasional slips and grammatical and stylistic infelicities but otherwise scrupulously avoided any pretense of improving the text.  Thanks to Tiedemann, these lectures come to us thoroughly annotated.  He has taken great pains to cite many of the original texts to which Adorno himself only refers in passing (sometimes correcting Adorno's mistaken attributions) as well as parallel passages taken from Adorno's  published work that clarify or illuminate his lecture points.  Above all, he has done the contemporary reader a great service in providing the historical background needed to appreciate the German cultural milieu in which Adorno's polemics are embedded.  (Incidentally, Tiedemann is not above inserting himself in some of these polemics, as when he excoriates Derrida's characterization of Benjamin's lone letter to Carl Schmitt regarding the latter's discussion of law and violence as an 'exchange' -- a characterization, he believes, that does too much honor to the unrepentant anti-Semite Schmitt, who never reciprocated Benjamin's overture to correspond.)  In addition to this hard labor of scholarship, Tiedemann succinctly captures the spirit of these lectures in his brief foreword, especially as they relate to broader themes in Adorno's thought.

There is an informal spontaneity -- dare I say almost chatty -- side to many of these lectures that make them most congenial reading and the ideal venue for advanced students who are just being introduced to the ideas of this formidable thinker.  Although Adorno makes fairly severe demands on his audience -- he obviously assumes that they already have some elementary grasp of German philosophy or are in the process of acquiring it -- he does not expect too much of his audience most of the time.  He carefully defines what he means by many technical terms and he often provides elementary background information linking his philosophical subjects with the important movements and events of their time.  He illustrates his points with many down-to-earth examples and he knows how to transfix an audience by recounting personal anecdotes -- some of them rather terrifying, as when he discusses the experience of having his house searched by the police in 1933 (p. 20).  His cast of characters ranges from the salt of the earth (the elderly cleaning lady) and the average bourgeois (the miser, the student examiner, etc.) to the very powerful (the Rockefellers).  These character types serve to remind us again and again of a fundamental historical lesson first brought to light by Vico and Hegel and later given a singular economistic formulation by Marx: "… we act not as ourselves but as the agent of our function."

For the more seasoned Adorno scholar there is the additional pleasure of reading Adorno's critical commentary regarding his own books and methods.  While there is nothing here quite as self-consciously self-referential as what one finds, for instance, in Nietzsche's writing, there are enough moments of self-revelation to make it personally as well as philosophically illuminating.

All of Adorno's astounding erudition, brilliant, fine-grained analyses, striking command of the finely turned phrase and pungent wit are on full display in these lectures, which because of their improvised quality -- except for the few he read directly from manuscripts - make them appear all the more impressive.  In my opinion, the most interesting lectures are those on negative universal history (#10, delivered on 10 December, 1964), on the principle of nationality (#12, delivered on 17 December, 1964), and the middle set of lectures composing Part II (##15 through 18, delivered 12-21 January, 1965).  The lecture on negative universal history contains a very close reading of Thesis XVII of Walter Benjamin's renowned late masterpiece, "On the Concept of History" (which appears in the English volume Illuminations under the title "Theses on the Philosophy of History"), a work to which Adorno -- perhaps too generously -- credits with having encapsulated the core of his own philosophy of history.  According to Adorno, if we follow Benjamin in interpreting history from the standpoint of the vanquished rather than from the standpoint of the victorious (who see themselves as the culminating endpoint of a logic that extends throughout all history), we will see each catastrophe as a singular constellation of possibilities -- the defiant acts of the crushed individual in the face of the overwhelming machinery of rational domination -- that open up a messianic rupture within history understood as the mythical return of the same.  This lecture not only serves as a foil for interpreting Benjamin's and Adorno's 'monadological viewpoint,' which credits micrological interpretation of life's fragments -- the melancholic memory of the dead and otherwise suppressed moments of human suffering, such as the Spartacus slave revolt in ancient Rome, the peasant uprising in Germany in 1525, or Babeuf's conspiracy under the Directory during the French Revolution -- as having preserved the force of the concrete particular against the power of the abstract universal.  It also (conversely) defends the Hegelian idea that identity and non-identity must be thought together; that the ahistorical universal and the immediate particular are both abstractions.  The lecture concludes with some very timely thoughts on how the "spell" cast by the identity principle -- which Adorno equates with the exchange principle of capitalism that informs all aspects of modern society -- perverts and corrupts the very forces that resist it (as witnessed by today's Muslim terrorists who merely replace the Bush version of manifest destiny with their own account of universal history).

The lecture on the principle of nationality could have been written today, since one of its concerns is to show that the nation-state -- as a real abstraction imposed on more naturwuchsig feudal associations -- has already been surpassed by the greater abstraction that is global capitalism.  That the modern Rechtstaat (or Kapitalstaat) is an abstraction can be felt, as Adorno notes, whenever we tear our children away from us and send them off to public kindergarten.  Still, according to Adorno, it was always the fear of collapsing into its own abstraction that led Romantic defenders of the nation state like Hegel to anchor it in something utterly alien to it: nature, or more precisely, race.  This contradiction, Adorno asserts, was played out in the collapse of the Weimar regime and the subsequent rise of National Socialism, which Adorno (following Franz Neumann and Otto Kirchheimer) sees as a thin varnish of contrived volkisch unity lacquered over deep economic and political conflicts.  Not surprisingly, Adorno has little faith in supra-national organizations such as the United Nations, the European Union, or the World Bank in resolving the crisis of the nation state in the face of today's global perils, preferring instead a decentralized deconstruction of the state apparatus as such (and in this respect he may be more realistic than the dominant Habermasian school of critical theory that calls for a new 'post-national constellation') (p. 111).

Part II of the course -- on the concept of progress -- mediates Part I's focus on universal history (understood as natural compulsion, or 'second nature' created by humanity in the throes of rationally objectifying itself) and Part III's concern with inward moral freedom, which Adorno defines as resistance to (or escape from) the "spell" of rational necessity.  Adorno begins this part of his course with some advice to his students on how they should respond to nominalists, analytic philosophers, and skeptical positivists who challenge them to positively define concepts like progress and freedom.  Following Adorno's advice, one should turn the question back on the questioner and ask whether anything done to him or her could count as a violation of his or her freedom or as a regression from what he or she expects or hopes for.  This exercise will show that concepts such as freedom and progress are as indispensable and substantively meaningful as they are elusive and self-contradictory (p. 140).  Adorno's own stabs at interpreting the concept of progress shows that it is intimately linked to the hope that the "global catastrophe" -- Adorno was thinking of Cold War nuclear annihilation whereas we today might think of massive environmental destruction caused by global warming -- can be averted (p. 143).  Progress, we are told, is a product of the ascendant eighteenth-century bourgeois who could still hope for a freer, happier, and more just life beyond the catastrophe vouchsafed by the ancien regime.  Once the bourgeoisie reigned victorious, its meaning became something utterly banal: increased industrial output and increased wealth.  But progress is not measured in technical advances but in the unfolding of humanity and of human society.  Furthermore, this unfolding is intrinsically dialectical since it would call upon the very technology of rational domination to overcome or tame rational domination (p. 157).  What the philistine bourgeois notion of progress masks is that in the realm of spirit or culture (as distinct from technology) every advance is marked by a regression or suppression of something that had previously been understood as problematic, or essential to the human condition (p. 168).

The lectures in Part III concerning freedom remind us that freedom is a product of bourgeois historical consciousness, i.e., the awareness of the individual's alienation from society and with it, the thought that things could be better in a different society.  Lecture 19 (26 January, 1965) begins with some important examples that serve to illustrate Adorno's anti-systematic (or anti-deductive) mode of micrological interpretation, whereby the particular fragment is taken as a cipher for understanding the totality of which it is a part.  According to Adorno, the use of a model -- such as 'free will' -- to interpret freedom, and the contextualizing of this model within a broader constellation of reciprocally determining concepts -- such as 'determinism,' 'responsibility,' 'action,' and 'intended consequence' as these bear upon, say, a concrete historical legal and moral debate regarding crime and punishment -- is inherently dialectical.  Using Kant's Third Antinomy as a foil, Adorno notes that freedom, for example, is 'determined' in its meaning by both subjective spontaneity and objective constraint (lawfulness), natural impulse and reason (as Adorno remarks, the so-called will power of the individual who possesses strong moral character is itself based on the solidity of something material and causally efficacious).  In the final analysis, Adorno submits that psychology and social science provide an important corrective to idealistic (or introspective, subject-centered) accounts of moral freedom of the sort exemplified in Kant's philosophy, since they show how much of the 'free moral subject' is really a product of psychological reflex and social conditioning, not to mention of social circumstance.  For the good will that actually succeeds in causing a good action presupposes a just and humane society that permits such an action to occur in the first place.  Given these dialectical qualifications to moral certainty, Adorno recommends a critical moral philosophy that will disabuse us of the narcissistic belief that we are capable of achieving moral action all on our own, without the "additive" of fortuitous empirical effects that lie outside of our immediate control.  So construed, the 'Hamlet syndrome' that seemed to Adorno's students to have rendered Adorno himself incapable of acting politically, the paradox that too much rational reflection paralyzes the will, is really morally ambiguous precisely because, as Adorno himself points out, the 'additive' impulse that eventually leads Hamlet to act with bloody rage -- the archaic, pre-moral desire for revenge -- is (to invoke Nietzsche) 'beyond good and evil,' that is to say, morally uncertain.

Let me conclude by briefly commenting on Adorno's treatment of his subjects.  Even when Adorno is severe in his criticism of Kant and Hegel he is careful to remind himself and his audience of how magnificent and progressive many of their fundamental insights are.  More often than not, he defends them against the shallow dismissals of less penetrating thinkers, even while acknowledging their considerable defects.  An honorable man, he even favorably recommends as 'magnificent' a book (The Theory of the Novel) whose author -- Georg Lukacs -- in that very book once famously denounced him as an aesthete living in the 'Grand Hotel Abyss.'  This even-handedness is also reflected in the polite but familiar way he addresses his audience as 'ladies and gentlemen' -- an anachronistic way of speaking which,  he reminds them, is not done out of naivete, but (we are to understand) out of respect for their humanity, a respect that is becoming increasingly at odds with the 'way of the world' as Adorno himself understood it.

Because a reviewer is expected to say something critical about the book he is reviewing let me conclude by noting a certain neglect that Adorno himself acknowledges in the scant attention he pays in his lectures to Condorcet, Rousseau, Herder and, most notably, Vico.  Adorno did repay his debt to Vico in his 1957 lecture on the introduction to philosophy of history (as Tiedemann points out in note 10, p. 292), an assessment of Vico which he seems to have drawn from Horkheimer's essay "The Beginnings of Bourgeois Philosophy of History."  This essay credits Vico for having been the first to assert that "human beings are blind … to the consequences of their own actions" (a notion that presages Hegel's 'cunning of reason') and for having rejected Cartesian subjectivism in favor of an objective and materialist (and hence dialectical) conception of history.  That aside, there is much more that could have been said about the remarkable affinities linking Vico with Adorno's critical project.  But that is a topic for another occasion.