History Man: The Life of R. G. Collingwood

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Fred Inglis, History Man: The Life of R. G. Collingwood, Princeton UP, 2009, 385pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691130149.

Reviewed by Peter Johnson, University of Southampton



Philosophical biography is as old as philosophy. In the third century Diogenes Laertius wrote wittily and informatively about the lives of philosophers, sometimes telling us about their work, sometimes about their often inglorious attempts to live a philosophic life. In our world few professional philosophers live, or even aspire to live, in the manner of a Socrates or an Aristotle, and even fewer, one suspects, would regard their lives as exemplary if they did. For most contemporary philosophers teaching philosophy in large modern universities, work is about much the same as a day at the office. Moreover, philosophers in our world make use of the work without needing to know a great deal about the life. Journals abound with articles on almost every philosophical topic imaginable. Routinely, philosophers, like scientists or historians, successfully exploit this material while remaining largely ignorant of the lives of those who produce it.

And, yet, philosophical biography flourishes. Few major philosophers have not received the full biographical treatment. We should note that word major, for it acts as an assumption and a warning. The assumption is not only that major work in philosophy warrants a biography of the philosopher, but that the life will illuminate the work in ways that reflection on the work alone will fail to do. The warning arises from the assumption, since it is sometimes necessary to remind biographers that what makes a major philosopher is precisely the work alone. What uniquely attracts attention is the quality of the argument, the clarity and precision of the insight, the sustained demolition of a point of view or the spirit in which the philosophy is expressed, or, perhaps, some combination of all these. Even when an original philosophical voice explains what motivates it to do philosophy, or tells us why we should think philosophy worthwhile, we are listening in a different key.

Philosophers sometimes write their own biographies. One such is R. G. Collingwood’s An Autobiography, rightly considered a classic of its kind. In general, Collingwood had little time for biography. He thought it intrusive, vulgar and, even when well written, a form of writing that panders to the worst of readers’ motives. Biography seeks the artist behind the art, the philosopher behind the philosophy, and in doing so peddles the illusion that it is the life which explains the work. Collingwood insists that his work stands apart. The Preface to Collingwood’s Autobiography tells us exactly how it should be read — “the autobiography of a man whose business is thinking should be the story of his thought” — that is, the story of his philosophy as he saw it from the perspective of 1938, of how his ideas emerged and developed and how his search for a rapprochement between philosophy and history and theory and practice came to shape his intellectual life. We can be pretty sure that Collingwood would not have encouraged a biography. It may be, too, that at least a small motive for Collingwood writing his autobiography is that it spared him the attentions of a biographer. If there is any truth in this then Collingwood’s ruse proved successful for some seventy years at least, until this year with the appearance of Fred Inglis’s History Man: The Life of R. G. Collingwood, a work which gives Collingwood exactly the kind of scrutiny that, one suspects, he would have welcomed least.

Philosophical biography sheds greatest light on its subject when the biographer displays a firm grasp not only of the work and life of the philosopher, but also of the connections between them. Alertness to how the philosopher’s personality expresses itself in the work, and how the work makes an impact on the life, would seem to be a quality that even the most sceptical of commentators on the genre would have to admit. Philosophical biographers need to allow their subjects to speak for themselves. But what if the subject’s way of speaking in philosophy is at odds with the operating assumptions of the biographer? In this case it is not just that the biographer’s own philosophical ideas are different from those of the subject, or that the subject’s life is so alien to the biographer that it is hard to get any kind of purchase on it. So the biographer must part company from the subject if the biography is to be written at all. But, then, who is the biography a biography of?

There is little doubt that Inglis writes as an admirer of Collingwood. So Inglis is not in the position of a biographer who is faced with giving an account of the life of a philosopher whose ideas he does not value. Nevertheless Inglis is faced with the problem of telling the story of Collingwood’s life in terms that are not always Collingwood’s own. In part, this is because Collingwood clearly resented biographical intrusiveness. In part, also, this is because Collingwood saw the story of his life as the story of his life as a philosopher and archaeologist. Such a self-imposed frame of reference would surely challenge any biographer wishing to track down the connections between Collingwood’s various activities and occupations. Inglis certainly spends a great deal of time tracking these connections down, but he does so only on the basis of assumptions which Collingwood does not share. Since these are implicitly philosophical assumptions about how a philosophical biography should be written, they control the direction that Inglis’s biography takes.

Inglis briskly rejects Collingwood’s autobiographical determination to tell the story of his life solely in terms of his work. For Inglis, “the story of a thinker’s thought is then indistinguishable from the story of his life”, a working assumption which, if true, would make it impossible to evaluate the work independently of the life (p29). Since we do commonly evaluate philosophical texts — say, Russell’s Principia Mathematica or Collingwood’s Speculum Mentis — quite separately from their author’s lives, Inglis seems to be privileging inter-connectedness rather than showing us as readers how it might come about. Of course, not all philosophical biographers will follow Inglis in making this assumption, nor will many of them wish to pin down this unitary life in terms of the twin themes that Inglis outlines towards the end of his first chapter. Here Inglis speaks about Collingwood as representative “of a certain kind of Englishman”, one whose over-arching need is to unlock the unity behind the many different activities and practices in which human beings engage, and to express that unity in a philosophically convincing form (p31).

Now it is tempting to think of Collingwood’s life as exhibiting a certain kind of earnestness, but this does not mean that being in earnest in art or music amounts to the same thing as being earnest in philosophy, nor does it mean that anyone earnest in philosophy must be equally earnest in everything else. Some activities either prohibit earnestness because they simply catch the mood or they just suit the occasion, and others do not need it because they are routine matters of matching means to ends. Similarly, while Inglis is right to stress that at least at one stage in Collingwood’s philosophical development the exhibition of the unitary character of human experience was a vital problem for him, and in some sense, arguably remained so for most of his philosophical life, little follows from this regarding biographical method. Inglis himself admits that “it is no use looking for a systematic and dovetailed political and philosophic vision in Collingwood’s work” and, in any case, it is perfectly possible for a philosopher to be concerned with the nature of the unity of human experience as a philosophical problem without distributing that concern evenly, or, possibly at all, over each of the many different kinds of activity that make up a life (p284).

It is true that Inglis draws on a number of Collingwood’s own ideas to instil method and purpose into his biography. But Inglis’s attempt to speak in Collingwood’s voice sometimes fits uneasily with his own. So, when Inglis speaks about the job of the biographer as the re-enactment of his subject’s thought, he does so in the context of his view that the philosopher’s thought as a philosopher and his life are indistinguishable. Now Collingwood certainly rejected the picture of philosophy as a form of logical analysis akin to mathematics, but if, for Collingwood, philosophy lacks the impersonality of mathematics it does not follow that he thought philosophical difficulties of a piece with personal ones. There are many passages in Collingwood’s works where he does not write philosophy clinically, and it would be impossible to arrive at a sensitive reading of, for example, Collingwood’s An Essay on Philosophical Method without an appreciation of the personal signature that marks much of its prose. None of this, however, gives the biographer a general licence to formulate the philosophy in the context of the life. Inglis makes a similar imaginative leap, on this occasion rather more explicitly, when he rebukes Collingwood for his insistence that the historian’s business is not with his subject’s feelings, but with their thought (p267). Clearly, if Inglis wishes to make biography more like history and if he wishes, as he surely must, to retain biography’s concern with its subject’s feelings as much as with their thoughts then he has to find room in biography for the re-enactment of feelings. But Collingwood excludes feelings from re-enactment and so Inglis must either separate biography from history or turn biography into art. That Inglis takes neither route consistently illustrates the degree of difficulty he faces, and, indeed, he concludes with an account of biography as an amalgam of history and art which is not likely to convince many, least of all one committed to Collingwood’s broad philosophical point of view (p313).

Defenders of philosophical biography will say that it enables us to understand a philosopher’s work not differently, but better. Collingwood, however, is absolutely clear that biography is not history. Equally important for Collingwood is his view that historical knowledge is more like a condition of human understanding in general than simply a specialised part of it. Thus, it is through historical understanding that we discover the thoughts of a neighbour, a person crossing the street, or the meaning in the pages of a diary. Further, the rapprochement which Collingwood looked for in the relation between history and philosophy could only be achieved if history was conceived in this way. There can, therefore, be no rapprochement between philosophy and biography. In other words, the rapprochement between history and philosophy is possible. The rapprochement between philosophy and biography is not. So, for Collingwood, it is not sufficient for philosophical biographers to claim that they are showing us previously unseen connections between the work and the life. Even on this modest basis there will be some occasions where the life sheds light on the work, and others where either it sheds none or it leads to the work being misunderstood. Biography, in Collingwood’s understanding, must always remain a scissors-and-paste affair, and, as such, it is wholly unreliable as a means of understanding the philosopher’s thought. Thus, while a history of Collingwood’s thought will tell us a great deal about it, a biography of Collingwood’s life will not. Any philosophical biographer will face this difficulty. In the case of the biographer of Collingwood, the difficulty is acute since the biographer has no choice but to speak in terms other than Collingwood’s own. And this surely means that they are not then writing a life of Collingwood.

The best philosophical biographers do not litter their pages with worries about the very possibility of what they are doing. They simply get on with telling the story of the philosopher’s life. Where Inglis does this, he, too, is often at his most convincing. Nevertheless the very possibility of biography is at the centre of the biographer’s enterprise. The biographer’s answer to what it is that makes biography possible at all will shape the way it is written, which in turn affects the way in which the subject of the biography is brought to life. Some answers will kill the life stone dead, which is why the skill at making the reader feel a part of the life as it is lived is so important. Thankfully, Inglis rejects the idea that Collingwood’s thought can be divided into periods, but the pull to find the key to understanding the life and thought as a unitary whole remains irresistible. In one sense, this almost invariably succumbed-to temptation is an occupational hazard for philosophical biographers, for they tend to focus less on specific points of philosophical substance and more on capturing the spirit in which the philosophy is written. When we link this to the commonly held idea that the essential purpose of biography is to reveal the life’s animating principle, then it is not difficult to see why it is judgements of the life as a success or failure, happy or unhappy, which usually bring the biography, if not the life, to an end. Inglis quotes Dorothy Emmet’s cautionary remark that “no doubt Collingwood’s views on the development of thought make it appear more of a unity than it actually is” but, one suspects, without really wanting to take it to heart (p165).

Collingwood expresses the relation between history and biography by means of a justly famous image — “the tides of thought, his own and others’, flow crosswise, regardless of its structure, like sea-water through a stranded wreck” (The Idea of History, p304). It may appear a little unfair to compare the first biography of Collingwood to a “stranded wreck” were it not for the fact that Inglis is obviously aware of Collingwood’s view and, indeed, makes adventurous and, in the view of this reviewer, ultimately doomed attempts to deal with it. By contrast with biography, “at its best, it is poetry; at its worst, an obtrusive egotism”, (The Idea of History, p304) Collingwood writes bluntly. But consistent with his understanding of history, re-enacting a philosopher’s work historically allows us to get to the core of his philosophical difficulties unhindered by the artificial fusion of life and thought. Thus, two recent and important works on Collingwood by Stein Helgeby and Marnie Hughes-Warrington (neither mentioned by Inglis) re-enact Collingwood’s ideas critically and completely independently of the life, so keeping them alive by making them their own.

Inglis writes well about the background to Collingwood’s philosophy, but the danger is that what is background to the philosopher becomes centre stage to the biographer. When this happens, as it might if the biographer lets slip a degree of impatience with the thought, then the life of the philosopher overshadows the philosophy, as the life of the poet might the poetry or the scientist the science. But to the philosopher, as Collingwood’s own autobiography makes transparently clear, it is the philosophy that is pre-eminent. Thus, we pay testimony to Collingwood’s life better through his philosophical writings than by any other means. In this respect, Collingwood’s relegation of biography below history confirms what we know already — that whereas biography can entertain, edify or distract, it is through history alone that Collingwood’s philosophy can be kept alive. In his remarks on biography Collingwood does allow that it can be historical to a degree. Biographers should not, however, take this as a cause for celebration because Collingwood also says that fundamentally, in terms of its basic principles, biography is in essence “anti-historical”. Biographers of Collingwood should, then, give up hope. To a biographer who entitles his book History Man this news should come as no surprise.