History of Madness

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Michel Foucault, History of Madness, Foreword by Ian Hacking, Jean Khalfa (ed.), Jonathan Murphy and Jean Khalfa (trans.), Routledge, 2006, 725pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415277013.

Reviewed by Colin Gordon, Royal Brompton & Harefield NHS Trust


'Work: that which is capable of introducing a significant difference in the field of knowledge, at the cost of certain pains for the author and reader, and with the possible reward of a certain pleasure, namely that of access to another figure of truth'. Michel Foucault's close friend and insightful commentator Paul Veyne recently published, at the age of 75, what may be his magnum opus, L'Empire Greco-Romain.  The book is published in a series of which Veyne and Foucault were founding editors, entitled 'Des travaux' (lamely translatable as 'Works'). The motto of the series, cited above, was surely written by Foucault.  History of Madness, the book which made Foucault's name and career, written as a doctoral thesis and published in 1961 when he was 34, certainly qualifies as a 'work' in all the designated respects.

That Histoire de la Folie has at last been translated in full, in the year of what would have been Foucault's 80th birthday, is, of course, much to be welcomed. So as to duly celebrate the occasion, we can perhaps leave aside the question of why it has taken so long, how far through the obstruction or negligence of publishers and heirs, how far through the indifference of English-language historians and commentators long content to dismiss or marginalise a work they had never found it necessary to read in full. The English historian Roy Porter, for one, pronounced, towards the end of his own life, that Foucault had been the greatest of historians of psychiatry -- but only, it has to be said, after he had previously indulged at length in cursory caricature of Foucault's work.

There have been four editions of this book in France. The original edition published by Plon in 1961 was titled Folie et Déraison. Histoire de la Folie à l'Age Classique. The second (1963) was heavily abridged for the 10/18 budget paperback series, which in slightly augmented form was translated by Richard Howard in 1965 as Madness and Civilisation. The three unabridged French editions contain identical main texts with differing prefaces and appendices. For the republication by Gallimard in 1972, Foucault shortened the title to Histoire de la Folie à l'Age Classique, suppressed his 1961 preface, and supplied a short new preface explaining the suppression. This edition included two new appendices, a short paper published in 1964 and a response to a critique by Jacques Derrida. The appendices were in turn omitted from the Gallimard Tel edition published in 1976. This English edition contains both prefaces and both appendices, and adds for good documentary measure another reply to Derrida, never included in any French edition, and a facsimile of R.D. Laing's enthusiastic reader's report for the 1965 English translation. There are also some sombre black and white plates of works by Bosch, Dürer, Hogarth, Goya and Fleury, which I think appeared only in the 1961 French edition. Foucault may later have come to view his controversy with Derrida as a storm in a teacup, and Derrida may have come to agree. It is excellent, however, to have the 1961 preface once again available: for its careful balancing of affective engagement and methodological scruple; for the libertarian passion of the closing quotation from René Char's Partage formel: 'A new mystery sings in your bones. Cultivate your legitimate strangeness'; for the proposal of 'a history of limits -- of those obscure gestures …  through which  a culture rejects something which for it will be the Exterior'; and, within the discussion of these 'limit-experiences', for the paragraph which inspired Edward Said: 'In the universality of the Western ratio, there is this division which is the Orient … ' [1]. It would be worth investigating whether Foucault's sketch for a comparative historical sociology of social limits and exclusions may have also influenced the current of governmental thinking which a generation later made 'social exclusion' a primary theme of social and urban policy, in France and then in Britain.

Another reason why it is useful to have this Preface once again available is because it shows how crassly Derrida, apart from his challenge to Foucault's reading of Descartes' Meditations and his charges of intellectual terrorism and violence and of an 'act of internment' which 'renders all straightjackets possible', misrepresents the stated project of Foucault's book.[2] Foucault's 1961 preface says that he would have liked to write a history of 'madness itself, in all its vivacity, before it is captured by knowledge', but that this is for more than one reason impossible, and that he therefore proposes to do something else. Derrida states that the 1961 preface proposes to undertake a history of 'madness itself'. Subsequent readers who have not had access to the preface have in some cases credulously accepted this falsehood (at one point even Foucault himself seems to have believed it), despite the evidence of the book, which contains not a word about 'madness itself'. Regrettably, Ian Hacking repeats Derrida's falsehood in his Foreword to this edition.

The editor, Jean Khalfa, points out in the text where the new translation corrects one notable (but happily rare) mistake in the 1965 version by Richard Howard, which I pointed out in 1990, where the phrase 'une vie facilement errante' (referring to the often vagrant condition of the Mediaeval insane) was unfortunately rendered as 'an easy wandering life' -- an image which then provided an easy target for debunking scholarly critics. I disagree, however, with David Macey's opinion that this volume improves on the quality of Richard Howard's translation. Howard is a gifted and distinguished translator. If he had translated Foucault's other books, at least one disaster would have been avoided.  Where it is not following in Howard's steps, this translation adds a number of its own errors. In a discussion of Christian attitudes to the poor, 'Dieu fait homme' is translated (407) as 'God-made man' -- turning a reference to the Incarnation into one to the Creation; the phrase 'un ordre dispersé' -- referring to the heterogeneous and fragmentary modes of the experience of madness in the West, and in the Enlightenment period in particular -- is translated as 'a random order' (163). The landed property of French leper-houses becomes a 'land bank' (4). 'Toujours' is translated as 'always' where it means 'still' (131), 'dénoncé' as 'denounced' (344, 345) where it means 'betrayed', and 'aliénés' as 'alienated' (498 and elsewhere) where it means 'lunatic' or 'insane'. Mistakes are even added which Howard avoided: 'résurrections imaginaires' cannot, unfortunately, be translated as 'imaginary resurrections' (363); Howard has here the serviceable rendering 'iconographic resurrections': Foucault is talking about the recurrence of similar motifs in the imaginations of different epochs. Routledge might have done better to retain and complete the Howard translation, and attend to repairing the many gross blunders in their 35-year old version of Foucault's next book, Birth of the Clinic.

One of the few liminal items not reproduced here from French editions is the text from the dustjacket of the 1961 Plon hardback, which Foucault must himself have written. It recounted that, after passing through several renowned educational institutions in France, the author had lived successively in the social democratic paradise of Sweden, the people's democracy of Poland and the neo-capitalist fortress of West Germany, as a result of which he had come to know 'what an asylum is'. In its daring ellipsis, this remark intimated to the reader a mutual implication, both personal and impersonal, between the historical subject of Foucault's book (the fate of the insane in modern Europe and the genesis of its institutions of psychiatric internment) and the historical forms of freedom and unfreedom in European societies after the Second World War. We know that Foucault chose to work outside France in the 50s in part because as a homosexual he found French society hard to live in, and his stays in the French Institutes at Uppsala, Cracow and Hamburg gave an experience in measuring, from a specific point of view, the extent and quality of 'asylum' available in three other socio-political European environments. The blurb's play on the word 'asylum' intimated that places of flight and refuge, and spaces of capture or oppression, sometimes transpire to be one and the same: an idea which was indeed central to this book.  Histoire de la Folie has been a book which captures and interacts with powerful historical forces, in ways and with effects which (as Foucault was to remark on his 1972 preface) elude any sovereign authorial intention. One of those forces, still embryonic in 1961, was antipsychiatry. Another was a factor which Foucault said he grasped only much later, that a work with critical implications for psychiatry could be interpreted in some progressive quarters as an attack on the Soviet Union; though there are already indications in 1961 that Foucault could have anticipated objections from these quarters, where he notes (604, n2) that Marxist historians are 'curiously' close in their methods to corporate histories of psychiatry which present harmonious accounts of the unity of social and scientific progress.

These ambiguities signalled by Foucault in the notion of asylum are echoed in the epigraph of the second chapter of Foucault's book, 'The Great Internment':  'Compelle intrare' -- a phrase from St Luke's gospel (14:23, 'Go out on to the highways and along the hedgerows and make them come in, so that my house may be filled'), which had been used by St Augustine to justify the Church's right to coerce schismatics and heretics, and was the issue, in the late-17th century period critical to Foucault's study, of debate between Bayle and Bossuet, among others, over the justification of religious tolerance. While sceptical philosophy, Foucault's epigraph implies, fights the Enlightenment battle for liberty of conscience and belief, heresy is elsewhere being transferred from ecclesiastical jurisdiction and recategorised as one of the symptoms of a disordered life, and sanctioned as such by correctional internment -- albeit often in ecclesiastical institutions where techniques of spiritual pastoral and penitence remained an active component. Reason could be an enforceable orthodoxy; reason was normative, and in due course would become normality.

Foucault criticised Histoire de la Folie, sometimes perhaps overzealously, on a number of subsequent occasions -- not however in order to disown it but because, to the contrary, its project foreshadows the totality of his life's work.  There are such criticisms in his 1973-4 lectures on Psychiatric Power, which with the 1975 lectures on The Abnormal (both volumes have recently been translated by Graham Burchell) present an amendment and continuation of the narrative of Histoire de la Folie into the mid-19th century; the English-speaking reader will also find there, a few years before Alan Bennett, a discussion of Francis Willis's treatment of the madness of George III.[3]  In his inaugural lecture at the Collège de France in 1970, in the course of a ceremonious but evidently sincere homage to his predecessor and teacher, the Hegel scholar Jean Hyppolite, Foucault said that Hegel is a thinker who we may think we have surpassed but who may turn out to be waiting for us around the next corner of the road. Foucault had found it necessary, by 1970, to repent of a vestige, in his treatment of the early modern experience of madness, of a Hegelian phenomenological style of history which hypostatises the subjectivity of epochs. But rereading his full text shows us what a plural and empirically discriminating application Histoire de la Folie gives to this notion of experience. Foucault was to take up the notion of experience again in his final work on the history of practices of the self, and there is a prominent and respectful reference to the Phenomenology of the Spirit in the 1982 lecture on The Hermeneutics of the Subject, and in a famous lecture of 1984. Looking back in 1984, Foucault had no difficulty in seeing his work from Histoire de la Folie on as a consistent enterprise. In the past, both friends and antagonists -- Dreyfus and Rabinow, and Peter Dews -- may have given excessive currency to the image of Foucault's work as an erratic Bildungsroman, a series of doctrinal lurches from autocritique to autocritique. Now that Foucault's death is as distant from us in time as the publication of his first major work was from that of his last, it may be time to take a break from these belittling developmental tropes, and, without losing sight of Foucault's quintessential and continuing daring and inventiveness, to see what can be made of a reading of his works in their massive underlying consistency and coherence -- a coherence which new publications, as well as this belated translation, make ever more visible.

The wide audience which has taken up the concept of governmentality from Foucault's lectures of 1978-9 (published in their full text in 2004, forthcoming in translation) will, for example, immediately recognise an important element of their subject matter already developed in Foucault's 1961 account of mutations in the politics of assistance and security in 18th-century France, organised around the concept of population. The entire phenomenon of 'the Great Internment' under the ancient regime, administered by the King's lieutenant de police, which occupies the centre of Foucault's investigation, needs, of course, to be read in the light of Foucault's later analysis of 'police' as a governmental rationality for the regulation of conduct; just as the account of Pinel's unchaining of the insane no doubt foreshadows his much later discussions of liberal government as the production and consumption of freedom (one of the key chapters of Histoire de la Folie is called 'Du bon usage de la liberté'). The genealogy of 'normal man' and the conditions of possibility of psychiatry are linked in Foucault's account to new syntheses and realignments of the functioning concepts of social, legal and political subjectivity -- the liberty, capacity and orderly conduct of subject and citizen.

In the 1970s, Foucault returned to work on a volume of selections from the Bastille archives of the documents he had cited in Histoire de la Folie, the letters written by relatives demanding, and by police officials authorizing, the arrest and internment of troublesome and disgraceful persons (Le désordre des familles (1982), co-edited with the feminist historian Arlette Farge -- another work which awaits its English-language translator and publisher.) An arresting essay from 1977, 'The lives of infamous men', memorably conveys Foucault's fascination with these haunting archival traces of lost lives; there is no better antidote for the stereotypical image, sometimes propagated even by those who should know better, of Foucault as the cold chronicler of faceless institutional and discursive structures. I would guess that Foucault's interest in the French microsociology of denunciation was not of a purely antiquarian nature; he had grown up under the Pétain regime and still perceived marked vestiges of pétainisme in the France of the 70s.

A decade or more before his readings of Beccaria and the Panopticon, Histoire de la Folie describes other Enlightenment projects for improved penal institutions, 'the best of all possible worlds of evil'. Most interesting perhaps, and most challenging to the strict periodisations beloved of the commentators, are the anticipations of Foucault's last works on truth-telling and ethics. The early modern rationalist appropriations of earlier techniques of self, in Descartes' Rules for the Direction of Mind and Spinoza's Essay on the reform of the Understanding, figure in Foucault's work, early and late, as moments in Western culture where certain options are opened while others are closed off: in Histoire de la Folie, they close off the possibility of unreason which was still present to Montaigne as a chronic propensity of our rationality; in the 1978 lectures, Descartes' Rules and Meditations are linked to the problematisation of government and conduct; and in Hermeneutics of the Subject (1982), to the receding possibility of a modern philosophical culture of the self.  The discussion in Histoire de la Folie of Rameau's nephew -- the character in Diderot's satiric fiction which so deeply impressed Goethe and Hegel, a kind of modern reincarnation of the Cynic philosopher as ragged-trousered, joking truth-teller -- might well now provide a chapter for a history of the idea and practice of parrhesia, such as Foucault was to outline in his Berkeley lectures on Fearless Speech.

One other important path of exploration in and from Histoire de Folie remains, as far as I know, unexplored. The book was Foucault's thesis for that now extinct French academic qualification, the doctorat d'état. One's sense of the august rank of that qualification is enhanced by the knowledge that Histoire de la Folie was only one of the theses Foucault submitted. His second, or 'supplementary' thesis was a translation, with extensive commentary, of Kant's Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View. This translation was published in France in 1964, accompanied only by a short extract from the commentary, the remainder of which was left unpublished. Some of the commentary's key ideas were later reworked in The Order of Things, especially in the chapter on 'Man and his Doubles'. Pirated transcripts of the French text (one with an English translation) can be found on the Web; a published translation may shortly be forthcoming. In reading parts of this thesis (such as the discussion of Kant's dietetics) one has the impression that Foucault's final books and lectures were revisiting, albeit with much enhanced analytical resources, issues in the connected problems of critique, ethics, anthropology and Enlightenment of which he already had a well developed awareness twenty-five years earlier.

Histoire de la Folie is the work of a young genius, a work of masterful accomplishment and prodigious and prodigal energy, grasp and daring. No richer, more multidimensional work of cultural and intellectual history has been written -- including by Foucault himself.  Some of its brilliances may now lie slightly outside the restricted focal range of contemporary post-modern attentions. Histoire de la Folie is modern, not post-modern -- and Foucault would have apologised only ironically for this shortcoming. If it had been translated in full on publication, parts of the English-speaking politico-academic landscape (the fields of social control and deviancy theory, notably) might have developed a little differently. Among its many offerings is a rich essay in the genealogy of public morals, an overview of the changing faces of social disqualification, disgrace and infamy (libertines and heretics, sorcerers and sodomists, among others) through whose peripeteia the modern face of mental illness finds its troubled origins. 

If one needs to propose a single timely reason to read Histoire de la Folie today, it is as a contribution to the issue in which a core part of our identity now seems to be at stake, the continuing historiography of Enlightenment. The idea which our leading intellectual historians (notably Jonathan Israel, J. G. A. Pocock and J. B. Schneewind) have respectively and variously advanced, of a history of Enlightenment in the plural, a series of multiple, conflicted enlightenments, is abundantly anticipated in Foucault's study. A leitmotif of the book is the demonstration of the fissured, disjointed articulations of the early-modern 'experience of unreason' -- which, as Ian Hacking's foreword reminds us, is the particular and at first sight, in our current terms of reference, slightly distant and elusive preoccupation of this book. Foucault's "âge classique" emerges as an age of internal discontinuities par excellence. In half-Hegelian, half-structuralist manner, Foucault postulates here that this very discontinuity can be made intelligible within the unitary, overarching framework of an epochal form or structure of experience; it was for this postulation of an epochal subjectivity that, from a later methodological standpoint, he afterwards criticised himself. 

J. G. A. Pocock has written that, while Continental culture was still struggling for its Enlightenment freedoms, the English-speaking were already engaged in the 'quarrel with modernity' -- living, that is to say, their Enlightenment as conscious contention in a public space with a problematic and uncertain present. Histoire de la Folie, published as it happens a year before Habermas's ground-breaking study of the early modern public space, is itself already well engaged in the theme of Enlightenment as explicit public problematisation of the present, which Foucault was later to develop in a noted series of discussions of Kant's essay What is Enlightenment? The chapter of this book called 'The Great Fear' deals with early manifestations of modern moral panic and the powerful Enlightenment awareness of madness as a socially and historically contingent and variable reality, and of mental illness as a symptom of modernity, secularisation, revolution and the casualties of progress (a problematic, in Kantian terms, of 'pragmatic anthropology'). Among Foucault's 18th-century medical sources on this topic is Johann Karl Möhsen, physician to Frederick the Great and one of the initiators of the Berliner Monatschrift debate on Enlightement which prompted Kant's essay. J. G. A. Pocock is said to have admired this book, and at these points it is not hard to see why. The words Foucault cites of the early forensic psychiatrist and sexologist C. F. Michea (noting their ambiguity) might have served as his epigraph: 'the history of madness is the counterpart of the history of reason' (377). But Foucault thinks this critical historical consciousness was buried by the dogmatic anthropology of the 19th-century human sciences, while asylum alienists reallocated the stigmata of modern madness from the hypochondriacal bourgeoisie to the degenerate poor.

Fifteen years after publishing this book, Foucault said in an interview, 'When I think back now, I ask myself what else it was that I was talking about, in Madness and Civilisation or the Birth and the Clinic, but power? Yet I'm perfectly aware that I scarcely ever used the word and never had such a field of analyses at my disposal'. The comment became one of the standard texts for accounts of Foucault's intellectual progress. But it has not often been asked how differently Histoire de la Folie might have been written had its author then been in possession of the notion of pouvoir-savoir -- or how far we might wish to rewrite or amend its analysis through the deployment of that notion. In fact what Foucault shows us in Histoire de la Folie is a domain within early modern society where power and knowledge, to a significant extent, go their separate ways: in this period medico-legal knowledges rarely visit, or practice, their expertise within the institutional spaces of internment (Roy Porter and others have disputed this, at least so far as medicine is concerned); the power to intern operates with summary and abrupt categories, often at the behest of pleas and petitions formulated by, and in the language of, the common people. The formation and rise to public moral authority of psychiatric power-knowledge, armed with a working doctrine of therapeutic internment, is a difficult process which is by no means fully accomplished at the threshold of the 19th century, where Foucault's 1961 narrative ends: that narrative still stands, in the light of theoretical hindsight, as an unequalled exploration of the complexities and local contingencies of that process -- contingencies of revolutionary politics in France, and of religious politics in England. At the climax of his account, with his deconstructions of the famous acts of liberation of the insane performed by the reforming alienists, Samuel Tuke and Philippe Pinel, with the emerging themes and techniques of an individualising institutional gaze (Cabanis's invention of the 'asylum journal') and the taming power of visibility, we can see that we are already in the close ideological vicinity of Bentham's Panopticon (interestingly, Foucault's first extant mention of that text has, so far, proved to be the 1973-4 lectures on psychiatric power, in terms of its relevance for the birth of the asylum, not that of the prison).

On the question of dualities and discontinuities in historical experience, one may note that there is one such notion, long beloved of English-language scholars, which is markedly absent from, and implicitly debunked from, Foucault's account, namely that of Cartesian mind-body dualism. Descartes is an actor in Foucault's history, principally for having excluded from the perils of sceptical self-doubt the possibility of one's own madness; Cartesians also feature in his survey of mental medical theory and practice; but the mental medicine, Cartesian or other, is shown to present a classically holistic repertoire of somatic and mental therapies. What Foucault afterwards calls the 'modern soul' is not Cartesian, but the product of a later reorganization of corporal and moral interventions, within the matrix of what Foucault later identified as 'the disciplines'.

After we have taken proper note of the descriptive and analytical richness, the subtlety and methodological resourcefulness, and the nuanced synchronic and diachronic discriminations in Foucault's account of an epoch and its end, questions remain about the key connection which the narrative structure of the book is designed to powerfully articulate, the idea of a linkage between the self-affirmation of early modern philosophical reason and the social repression of unreason as identified in the form of disordered conduct. The connection would not appear to be always direct or straightforward. The same king who, in 1657, decreed the establishment of the Hôpital Général of Paris, decreed the 1671 ban on the teaching of Cartesian philosophy in French colleges and universities. What, if any, is, and what precisely did Foucault take to be, the logical or material link between the Cartesian cogito, reason of state and the subject-matter of Delamare's Traité de police? Or alternatively, for the English historian, what are the linkages between Leviathan, Locke and Poor Law reform (James Tully has made useful progress on parts of this question)?  One still dreams of a generation of professional historians prepared to grasp and willing to engage with such questions -- as receptively, indeed, as the generation of French historians (Braudel, Mandrou, Le Goff) who were prepared to appreciate and engage with Foucault's work as a cutting-edge contribution to their field[4], rather in the same way that an Irish historian, Peter Brown, was creatively engaging at about the same time with the anthropology of Mary Douglas. These questions are not answered to our -- nor doubtless to his -- full satisfaction in Foucault's text. There is now a burgeoning academic sub-literature of complaint about the things which Foucault left undone, as though he had neglected his duty to write his readers' books as well as his own. We are not, however, forbidden from attempting some of those uncompleted tasks ourselves. In any event, it is fitting, even from our latter-day vantage, to appreciate to what extent this was a book in which new, and still pertinent, forms of historical interrogation were being invented -- a work which, at the cost to the reader of a modest effort, may still offer possibilities of access to 'another figure of truth'.




[1] Later in the book, Foucault notes that the most enlightened late mediaeval methods for the care of the insane in Europe, such as those in the famous hospital in Saragossa (1425), may have been derived from Arab models.

[2] The editor of this translation, Jen Khalfa, offers in his Introduction an assessment of this celebrated controversy which, following other previous accounts, refers several times to the remarkable 'violence' of Foucault's response to Derrida. Comparing the language of the respective texts, it is not clear that Foucault's is the more aggressive or intemperate of the two.

[3] The contemporary publication which most ably continued the analysis of Histoire de la Folie was Robert Castel's admirable L'Ordre Psychiatrique (1976), translated as The Regulation of Madness (Polity/California UP, 1988).) An alternative, later treatment by an American historian is Jan Goldstein's Console and Classify: The French Psychiatric Profession in the Nineteenth Century (Cambridge 1987 / Chicago 2002).

[4] See notably  'Les déviations réligieuses et le savoir médical' (lecture and discussion at a conference on 27-30 May 1962) in: Le Goff, J.: Hérésies et sociétés dans l'Europe préindustrielle (Paris: Mouton, 1968), pp. 19-25; reprinted in  Dits et Ecrits, vol I.