Hölderlin's Hymns "Germania" and "The Rhine"

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Martin Heidegger, Hölderlin's Hymns "Germania" and "The Rhine", William McNeill and Julia Ireland (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2014, 289pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253014214.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


Heidegger’s readings of Hölderlin are central to his later thought, but the difficulties of both the poetry and the thought make it a great challenge to translate these texts. One of Heidegger’s three lecture courses on the theme, dating from 1942, appeared in English in 1996 as Hölderlin’s Hymn “The Ister.” This collaborative translation enriched the understanding of Heidegger in English-speaking countries and led to an unexpected appropriation, David Barison and Daniel Ross’s 2004 documentary The Ister. Now the same pair of translators, William McNeill and Julia Ireland, have given us the 1934-35 lecture course on “Germania” and “The Rhine.” Their version, including a clear and concise introduction and useful glossaries, attains both accuracy and clarity, rarely faltering in its choice of words. We can now look forward to their translation of the 1941-42 course on Hölderlin’s “Andenken” (“Remembrance”), which is currently in progress.1

Heidegger’s goal is to think about Hölderlin’s poetry without reducing it to prose or pseudophilosophy (5). To this end, he casts aside various clichéd theories of poetry, including psychological interpretations and the notions of symbolism and expression (26-28). Instead, he tries to inhabit the language and mood of the poem, catching on to its “overarching resonance” and “fundamental attunement,” in order finally to find its “metaphysical locale,” the relation to being in which Hölderlin dwells (18). This is a crucial task if great poetry is not just a flimsy aesthetic diversion but language at its most intense and genuine; the poet’s mission is to found a people’s relation to being by withstanding the divine lightning and bringing it into words (30-31, 33, 90, 227).

“Germania” pictures Germany as a maiden whom a divine messenger charges to “give counsel” to “kings and peoples” (16). The poem takes place in the absence of the ancient gods, for whom the poet longs without pretending to revive them, and in anticipation of a fresh destiny for Germany. Heidegger painstakingly elucidates the attunement that is at work here, characterizing it as “holy mourning in readied distress” (97). As he had insisted in Being and Time, such attunements are not just subjective overlays, but primordially open a world and its meaning (81).

From “Germania” Heidegger shifts to “The Rhine,” where Hölderlin’s aim is to limn “the beyng of the demigods” (223). (The archaic spelling “beyng” translates Heidegger’s less archaic Seyn, a spelling still used by Hölderlin.) Demigods, existing between gods and humans, are riven and unified by an “intimacy,” or harmony of opposites. There are similarities here to Heraclitus and Hegel (111-118), but according to Heidegger, Hölderlin develops an understanding of “beyng” all his own that stands outside the metaphysical tradition and points to the possible new “commencement” (Anfang) of a history that will decide the arrival or flight of the divine (1, 128-9, 201, 244).

Heidegger sums up the beyng of the demigods in a diagram (223)



that might remind us of various things: the relation between thrownness and projection in Being and Time (cf. 160 here), the conflict between earth and world in “The Origin of the Work of Art” (1935), the mirror-play of the fourfold in the 1949 Bremen Lectures, and (the impression is irresistible) the swastika that one can easily extract from this figure.

It is just as easy to see what those who are not among Heidegger’s admirers will make of all this. Why waste our time, they will ask, slogging through the murky fantasies and parochial preoccupations of a Nazi? Why follow him into a ponderous mythology, a hallucination of the supernatural patched together from the fragments of a mentally unstable Romantic poet? Whatever all this may be — one will say — it is anything but philosophy.

Heidegger would be the last to expect all readers to agree with him, but he would insist that the questions he is raising are important, and that there is something genuine at stake that needs to be thought. This, I believe, is true.

Let’s consider the political question first, as it is the most immediately pressing and disturbing, particularly in light of the recently published volumes of “Black Notebooks,” which contain several anti-Jewish passages. A crucial entry in the notebooks dating from the late 1930s tells us that from 1930 to 1934, Heidegger imagined that National Socialism could initiate a “new commencement.” He then came to recognize the movement as nothing but the extreme manifestation of the modern will to power — a manifestation that must nevertheless be “affirmed.”2 I take this affirmation as a sort of amor fati, a will that modernity should arrive at its destined catastrophe so that the other commencement may become possible.3 In any case, if Heidegger’s retrospective account is reliable, this lecture course from 1934-35 should represent a transition to a more wary and ambiguous relation to Nazism.

In certain regards and at certain moments, one can still take the lectures as an exercise in Nazi ideology. In exploring “‘politics’ in the highest and authentic sense” (195), Heidegger affirms the triumvirate of poet, thinker, and statesman — extraordinary human beings (or demigods?) who stand on high peaks and can creatively reinvigorate the nation in the domains of language, thought, and action (49-50, 168). If the first two are Hölderlin and Heidegger, it seems obvious who the third must be. One could patch together a more concretely political message from several passages: reclaiming “Earth” (e.g., 197) and our “endowment” (265), we will oppose the “Asiatic” (118, 158), not shying away from “battle” (Kampf, 112), inciting the Volk to know “what it wills” (126) in a time of “threat to our spiritual and historical Dasein” (103) when “the West [is] hovering at the edge of the abyss” (202). While there are no references to Jews, the biting comments on Christian churches (e.g., 202), together with Heidegger’s focus on the “Greco-Germanic mission” (132) and his intense interest in the gods who have “fled” (e.g. 73-4), anticipate a comment in the Black Notebooks from the early 1940s on the importance of rediscovering the first, Greek commencement, “which remained outside Judaism and thus outside Christianity.”4 Finally, although the book as we have it never directly names Nazism, Julia Ireland’s study of the original manuscript has led her to conclude that a reference to “the inner truth of natural science” (178), an odd expression for Heidegger, should actually read “the inner truth of National Socialism.”5

But the case is not closed with this discovery (as Ireland would agree). We have to reflect on the word “inner,” which implies a rejection of the “outer” manifestations of the Nazi movement.6 These include theories of the master race propounded by ideologues such as Alfred Rosenberg (27) and the attempt to subordinate science to the Volk (40). In a rather strange move for a Nazi, Heidegger imagines a Germany that is “defenseless” (to quote “Germania”); this is not “unilateral disarmament” (19), but the idea that a great enough nation would need no defense (263). On a deeper level, he points out, with Hölderlin, that it is “the national,” or “one’s own,” that is precisely what is most difficult to adopt and develop freely (264-66). The “fatherland” remains a “forbidden fruit,” supremely mysterious and challenging (4, 108, 267). Here, “fatherland” does not mean jingoistic and racist xenophobia, but the challenge of drawing on a heritage for the sake of a mission (123).

There is no doubt that Heidegger is writing as a German who is passionately concerned with the future of Germany, and that he sees this future as a “singular” destiny (169, 207) rather than conformity to “the shallow waters of some universal world reason” (263). It is difficult for us to avoid seeing this future-that-was as the gruesome nightmare that came to be — what after the war Heidegger himself described as the “reign of terror” under “Hitler’s criminal madness.”7 To be fair, though, we should consider the possibility that Heidegger’s “inner truth of National Socialism” pointed in a different direction. We should also recognize that national identity is not a program of conquest for Heidegger; it is a question that we must “pose — that is, sustain — throughout our entire short lifetime” (55). Such questions still face all human beings. So it is too simple to pigeonhole these lectures as a piece of political ideology. They are philosophy, which means that they “can, and indeed must, be comprehended otherwise”; they can “be discovered . . . ever anew and in an inexhaustible manner” (127).

Even the notion of “demigods,” which at first glance is nothing but a chimera, proves to be philosophically pertinent. As Heidegger explains, we necessarily fall short if we attempt to think of divinity, and we cannot but think beyond ourselves in order to understand humanity; thus we arrive at a space between humans and gods, the realm of the demigods (151). What he is proposing may seem absurd in a time when various forms of “naturalism” predominate, and we see ourselves as material beings who evolved from, and share much with, other life forms. But one can legitimately ask whether the full human experience can be appreciated in terms of the evolutionary process and neural makeup that have admittedly made this experience possible, or whether, instead, the full phenomenon has irreducible, emergent dimensions that demand to be understood not just on their own terms, but also in terms of higher possibilities — some ideals (not necessarily “supernatural” ones) in terms of which we interpret ourselves. Ironically, the more reductive forms of naturalism often bring with them their own ideal of a “demigod”: the techno-transhuman, the cyborg who encounters no limit to the mastery and possession of nature.

Against this ideal, Heidegger proposes that our being, at its highest, is “originary time” (99): that is, human beings are challenged to retrieve what we have inherited for the sake of a vocation, as we work toward fresh revelations of being and beings (57), constantly dwelling on the Earth (178-9), mindful of death (158). This originary time or “care” (55, 125, 255) is normally dormant, because we usually inhabit a degraded “everydayness” (22-24) where things simply seem to lie present before us, and the meaning of being and presence is taken for granted, falling prey to idle talk (59). Under the sway of this everyday mentality, we may focus on one or another domain of present entities and attempt, perversely, to explain ourselves in terms of it. This leads to countless “wretchedly banal” reductionisms — from Rosenberg’s attempt to understand experience as “the expression of the soul of a particular race” (27) to today’s “neurophilosophy.”

The presence in this lecture course of terms from Being and Time — everydayness, idle talk, care, thrownness, projection — may cause a certain cognitive dissonance for some English-language interpreters of Heidegger who have confined themselves to his work of the late twenties and who may find it difficult to absorb the seemingly far-fetched and far-flung speculations of the Hölderlin lectures. This situation is due to a certain reductive tendency in some Anglophone readings of Being and Time, which treat the analysis of everydayness in that work as fundamental; everything in Heidegger is then to be interpreted in terms of the familiar routines of coping and making, where people “are what they do” (cf. Being and Time, German pp. 126, 239). What this approach fails to see is that Heidegger’s account of the everyday environment is not intended as a foundation, but simply as a first clue that can point us to the richer phenomenon of care; in this sense, he can even say that “everydayness is properly care-freeness” (255). Once our horizons are broadened, we must flatly deny, as the present lecture course does, that what we do can ever exhaust who we are (55).

Quite apart from issues within Heidegger scholarship, or from the questions of German destiny that Heidegger explores here, there is a fundamental question at stake in this lecture course that every philosopher should consider. Most philosophy, and all natural science, obeys the Cartesian method of analysis and synthesis (Discourse on Method, Part 2): a complex whole is to be broken down into easily intelligible elements, and then reconstructed in terms of them. This is what it means for us to explain a thing, to understand it. But Heidegger bluntly says, “I take understanding to be the opposite in essence to explanation . . . understanding precisely lets what is inexplicable stand as such” (224). A whole world cannot be “glued together” out of parts (124). The whole calls for a poetic saying and philosophical discourse that can, at best, draw our attention to the mystery through “tentative directives” (24) and inquire into a “commencement” that is still more mysterious — inexhaustibly so (3, 214).

Is this view mysticism and obscurantism, the very opposite of philosophy? Or is it the Cartesian method that falls short of philosophy by refusing from the start to acknowledge the whole? This is not a question to be answered rashly.

For their helpful comments on this review I thank Gregory Fried, Julia Ireland, Jeff Love, Michael Mengs, and Thomas Sheehan.

1 We also have a translation of Heidegger’s shorter pieces on Hölderlin: Elucidations of Hölderlin’s Poetry, trans. Keith Hoeller (Amherst, N. Y.: Humanity Books, 2000).

2 Martin Heidegger, Überlegungen VII-XI, Gesamtausgabe vol. 95, ed. Peter Trawny (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 2014), 408.

3 On beyng as catastrophe, see, e.g., ibid., 50, 417.

4 Martin Heidegger, Anmerkungen II-V, Gesamtausgabe vol. 97, ed. Peter Trawny (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 2015), 20.

5 Julia A. Ireland, “Naming Φύσις and the ‘Inner Truth of National Socialism’: A New Archival Discovery,” Research in Phenomenology 44 (2014): 315-346. This correction could not be incorporated in the translation due to strictures on any deviations from the Gesamtausgabe edition, but future printings of the Gesamtausgabe edition may be corrected. The reading in the original edition is not a deliberate falsification, but an honest error; the manuscript (reproduced in Ireland’s article) is a tangle of deletions and insertions in Heidegger’s minuscule and challenging handwriting, and the expression in question is abbreviated. Still, Ireland makes a good case for her reading, as well as for her interpretation of the philosophical context.

6 The same caution applies to the notorious reference to the “inner truth and greatness” of Nazism in Introduction to Metaphysics, trans. Gregory Fried and Richard Polt, 2nd ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2014), 222.

7 Heidegger, Anmerkungen II-V, 84, 444. We must note that Heidegger uses such phrases in the context of his complaints about the postwar order, which he sees as no less disastrous than the Nazi regime.