Hobbes and Modern Political Thought

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Yves Charles Zarka, Hobbes and Modern Political Thought, James Griffith (tr.), Edinburgh University Press, 2018, 257pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474433464.

Reviewed by Ioannis D. Evrigenis, Tufts University


As Thomas Hobbes welcomes the reader to Leviathan, he signals his intention to highlight the perils and promise of the meaning of words. In one striking early example, he notes that the purpose of reading his book is to teach one how to read human beings, beginning with oneself. Taking issue with those who overuse but fail to grasp the importance of "nosce teipsum," Hobbes takes the liberty of translating the command as "read thyself," before moving on to pronounce the reading of mankind an activity "harder than to learn any Language, or Science." Heeding the call to focus on the reading of both books and human beings, commentators have devoted considerable attention to that aspect of Hobbes's political theory, with very fruitful results. Rather less attention has been devoted to the prerequisite activity, writing. By "writing," I do not mean Hobbes's own writing and his relationship to his readers, but the concept of writing in general, as it pertains both to the epistemological problems that animate Hobbes's political philosophy and to the ways in which nature imprints human beings with qualities that lead to conflict. One of the great virtues of Yves Charles Zarka's book is its consistent attention to these dimensions of writing, which allow him to thread a variety of issues in Hobbes's political thought together into a narrative running from the problems that Hobbes was called to solve to the ways in which he constructed his elaborate solutions and, thereby, shaped modern political thought.

The book is an English translation of Zarka's Hobbes et la pensée politique moderne (PUF, 1995). Apart from the translator's introduction, it consists of twelve chapters and a conclusion. In Chapter 1, Zarka addresses two large questions. The first is methodological and concerns the way in which one should approach older philosophical texts. The second is "why Hobbes?" The two questions are related, because Zarka describes his broader research interests as centered on "the moment where political philosophy, particularly in the seventeenth century, conceptually forges ethical, juridical and theological positions which involve the determination of the foundations of modern politics" (1). His approach is thus "simultaneously historical and philosophical." The substantive reason for this combination is that texts of the past must be studied according to "historically exact criteria," but also as "bearers of interrogations which raise determinations concerning the nature, value and end of the political to the level of concept, and thus involve our comprehension of the political" (1).

Using Leo Strauss and Quentin Skinner as exemplars of approaches that tend to focus on one or the other, Zarka asks whether we can be freed from the "fruitless" choice between "a political philosophy that affirms its identity as tearing away from history" and "a historicism that constructs a history of thought only at the expense of an [exhaustion] of the idea of political philosophy" (2), and suggests that his approach offers a better alternative. Zarka notes that there is much more to say on the issue of method, and some of it has been captured in a debate he and Skinner had in 1996.[1] It is worth noting, however, that both the rest of his brief discussion of method and the rest of the book reveal that he is mainly opposed to historicism. Invoking Strauss, Zarka argues that "historicism does not rest upon the incontestable observation of a fact, but on the interpretation of a fact" (6). Yet, certain thinkers -- and Hobbes is among them -- declare their intention to write not "of such and such particular state form but of the state in general, whatever the time and place" (7).

Unless one were prepared to take such statements of intent seriously at least some of the time, all examinations of past political thought would be not much more than studies of ideologies. Thus, while Zarka's inquiry is framed by an awareness of the historical circumstances in which Hobbes wrote, his focus is squarely on Hobbes's texts and the ways in which Hobbes's ideas evolved, less as responses to specific historical stimuli and more as attempts to perfect a political philosophy. This focus is also evident in Zarka's three main reasons for choosing Hobbes. First, while Hobbes's philosophy asks and attempts to answer fundamental questions, those are "inevitably masked by an exclusively historico-political interpretation" (8), masking its philosophical stakes. Second, Hobbes collected the concepts developed between the fourteenth and seventeenth centuries and made them objects of rational deduction. As such, his philosophy is "simultaneously an outcome and a point of departure," offering a "canonical" version that fueled modern inquiries into politics (9). Third, Hobbes is the one who perceived most clearly the "paradoxical character of politics" (9). Thus, using Hobbes as his point of departure, Zarka's aim is to provide "some clarifications of the concept of politics, more precisely, of the internal articulations of the modern concept of politics" (10).

The main body of the book consists of four parts. Part I, "Individual and State," includes two chapters, one contrasting Gracián's hero with Hobbes's anti-hero (Chapter 2), illustrating effectively the transition from conceptions of politics centered on rulers to attempts to use anthropological insights in order to understand how power and the state work. Chapter 3, "The Hobbesian Idea of Political Philosophy," begins with what Zarka sees as Hobbes's attempt to render the study of politics philosophical by moving away from civil history and towards a civil philosophy. At the heart of this claim lies an important decision about what to make of Hobbes's own description of his project and method and the many ways in which his works challenge them. Zarka argues that "One of the major turns that Hobbes carried out in the domain of political or civil philosophy consisted in giving to it a demonstrative status by discovering principles not in history, but in human nature" (36). This raises the obvious question of where these principles are to be discovered, to which Zarka replies that in Hobbes's hands "history became a source of examples from which we could eventually take lessons, but not a source of principles from which we could deduce consequences" (36). In The Elements of Law, Hobbes's notes that "experience concludeth nothing universally" (I.4.10) and argues that, while it might be prudent to conclude something based on the past, the past cannot become the basis for universal conclusions.

Yet, in the same work Hobbes also declares that the science that produces "true and evident conclusions of what is right and wrong, and what is good and hurtful to the being and well-being of mankind, the Latins call sapientia, and we by the general name of wisdom," adding that "generally, not he that hath skill in geometry, or any other science speculative, but only he that understandeth what conduceth to the good and government of the people, is called a wise man" (II.8.13). In Leviathan, Hobbes would reinforce this claim by pointing to the difference between experience (prudentia) and wisdom (sapientia), but he would also pronounce sapientia "infallible" (V). Given its source, however, it is doubtful that sapientia can live up to the latter expectation. Zarka's brief analysis of Hobbes's theory of human nature thus captures something important about Hobbes's methodological shift. Zarka rightly pays attention to the ways in which Hobbes's story regarding the passage from the state of nature to civil society changes between the two early political treatises and Leviathan, with its emphasis on authorization, the law, and the interpretation of Scripture.

Part II, "Language and Power" also consists of two chapters. In "Theory of Language" (Chapter 4), Zarka argues that not only is Hobbes's theory of language unified and coherent in its own right, but also that it serves as the foundation on which the unity and coherence of his entire theory depend. In "The Semiology of Power" (Chapter 5), Zarka examines the ways in which the writing and reading of different types of signs affect human relations. Here, the payoff of the methodological discussion in Chapter 1 becomes clear, as it enables Zarka to distinguish between different kinds of readings that can be applied to Hobbes's philosophy, thereby offering a powerful way out of some of the problems I hinted at earlier. For example, his analysis allows him to acknowledge the important role that physics plays in Hobbes's philosophy without forcing him to commit the common mistake of expecting ethics and politics to be reducible to it (72). Quite helpful in this distinction is the suggestion that human power can be better understood as "within the jurisdiction of semiology" (73). The focus on semiology is also useful in drawing attention not just to the reception of signs, but also to their production and dissemination, in particular the writing of laws.

Part III, "Fundamental Concepts of Politics," consists of five chapters, dealing with war (Chapter 6), law (Chapter 7), property (Chapter 8), the state (Chapter 9), and the right to punish (Chapter 10). For Zarka these topics form essential pillars of Hobbes's theory. They also represent areas in which Hobbes made pivotal shifts that bore significant consequences for modernity, up to the end of the eighteenth century. If anything, I think that Zarka is understating Hobbes's impact, as we are still experiencing the effects of his innovations whether we know it or not. Although Zarka acknowledges that there are other concepts one could examine, I think that a strong candidate for addition to his list is equality, the concept that Hobbes's thought arguably affected the most. Nevertheless, the chapters in this section achieve the goal of demonstrating Hobbes's role as a point of origin and a point of departure, as well as the way in which key pieces of his theory came together. There are many important insights in these chapters, but Zarka's central focus in describing this process is on the formation of a single will and its central role in engendering and legitimizing the commonwealth. Here, the earlier introduction of semiology pays dividends.

The final two chapters are devoted to examinations of Hobbes alongside Filmer (Chapter 11) and Pascal (Chapter 12), respectively. These are good choices. Filmer's assessment of Hobbes's political philosophy was very insightful and his own emphasis on the patrimonial kingdom raises a crucial question regarding Hobbes: why choose an alternative, cumbersome, and doubtful way to legitimize authority when others that appear effectively not so different were available? Zarka's comparison shows rightly that even though Filmer and Hobbes shared several assumptions, their views were ultimately quite different. In my view, Hobbes's decision was animated by the realization that democracy was on the horizon and that the social contract offered a way to both legitimize and enlist individuals to the common cause. In Pascal's case, Zarka notes that despite a widespread sense that his views are close to Hobbes's, there are in fact not only important divergences in regard to starting points, but also a significant difference in tone, where Pascal's irony feels very different than Hobbes's seriousness. In his conclusion, Zarka notes once more that his list of topics is not meant to be exhaustive, but rather illustrative of four major contributions that Hobbes made to modern political thought: 1) his theory of the universal individual, 2) his semiology, 3) his "notion of a public political will," and 4) his "juridical theory of political institution" (247-9).

Those who follow Anglophone scholarship on Hobbes will know that Zarka's work has been important despite the lack of English translations of his books. The publication of this book is a first step in making his work available to those who cannot access it in the original. Unfortunately, the translation in this case often stands in the way. Quite often it is literal to the point of obscuring the meaning of the original. For instance, "raison d'Etat" is rendered as "state reason" instead of "reason of state" (21), and terms such as "subtends," "consecution," and "adequation" are distracting. These problems do not change the fact that Zarka's commentary deserves to be read widely by Hobbes scholars and those interested in the history of modern political thought, who perhaps can next hope for a translation of his La décision métaphysique de Hobbes.

[1] Quentin Skinner and Yves Charles Zarka, Hobbes -- The Amsterdam Debate, ed. Hans Blom (Georg Olms, 2001).