Hobbes and the Law of Nature

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Perez Zagorin, Hobbes and the Law of Nature, Princeton UP, 2009, 177pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691139807.

Reviewed by Stewart Duncan, University of Florida



The late Perez Zagorin’s Hobbes and the Law of Nature is a recent addition to the large literature on Hobbes’s moral and political philosophy. Zagorin’s somewhat distinctive approach is to focus on the notions of law and right of nature. After introducing the traditions of natural law and natural right, Zagorin discusses Hobbes’s political philosophy as a sort of natural law approach. Hobbes’s approach in these areas differs in several ways from previous ones. But still, Zagorin thinks, it is valuable to look at Hobbes as a natural law theorist.

Hobbes and the Law of Nature, which is relatively short, has four chapters. Chapter 1 offers historical background on the notions of natural law and natural right. Chapter 2 then discusses the extent to which these notions are present in Hobbes’s work. Chapter 3 looks at sovereignty and restrictions on the sovereign in Hobbes’s system. Chapter 4, on moral philosophy, looks at self-interest, obligation, and the move from is to ought.

In his discussions, Zagorin tends to focus on Leviathan, though not to the exclusion of Hobbes’s other political works. That said, though Zagorin is sensitive to the possibility that Hobbes’s view may have changed over time, he is inclined to regard it as basically stable. Thus he tends to regard the Elements of Law, De Cive, and Leviathan as three statements of one view.

In the first chapter Zagorin sketches the evolution of the notion of natural law from Stoicism to Hobbes’s time, and makes some remarks about the history of the notion of a natural right. Much of the chapter focuses, however, on Grotius’s view and its relation to Hobbes’s view. With regard to both natural law and natural right, Zagorin argues that Grotius was not a significant influence on Hobbes. Hobbes “did not think much of him [Grotius] as a philosopher of natural law” (20). And Grotius was little concerned with the notion of natural right: far from being “a strong and original theorist of natural rights” (24), he actually “never achieved a well-defined and fully articulated conception of natural rights” (25). It would thus be a mistake to see Grotius as a significant influence on Hobbes in the realm of natural right, for Grotius had little to say about the topic.

The second chapter then discusses the notion of natural law in Hobbes’s work. Here Zagorin argues that Hobbes departs from the tradition of natural law in three significant ways. The first lies in the way Hobbes connects natural law closely to the desire for self-preservation. The second is the denial that natural law is law. And the third relates to the connections that Hobbes makes between natural and civil law. One might quite naturally start to wonder whether this is really natural law at all. After all, it’s not really law, and it’s grounded in self-preservation. But Zagorin takes the point of that grounding to be giving natural law a clarity and proper basis that it had lacked in previous accounts.

In the third chapter Zagorin addresses the role of the sovereign in Hobbes’s system. A significant aim of the chapter is to argue that there are moral obligations on the sovereign. Along the way, we get brief discussions of a variety of related issues. Thus there are discussions of readings of Hobbes as a de facto theorist and the Engagement controversy (72-4); and of the views about Hobbes, liberty, and republicanism that Quentin Skinner defends in Hobbes and Republican Liberty (76-80).

Finally, chapter four discusses “Hobbes, the Moral Philosopher”. Before a brief conclusion, it is divided into four sections: “Self and Others”, “Obligation”, “Is and Ought”, and “Religion and Toleration”. The first two sections discuss issues of egoism, self-interest, and prudence. The third addresses the rather sudden shift in Hobbes’s project from the descriptive to the normative and argues that “Hobbes’s laws of nature are not a fallacious deduction of values from facts” (117). The final section discusses aspects of Hobbes’s attitude towards religion. Zagorin draws attention to such things as Hobbes’s discussions of heresy, his belief that “the only article of faith necessary for salvation was that Jesus was the Christ and Messiah” (125), and his remarkably positive remarks about Independency in the “Review and Conclusion” to Leviathan. Although, as Zagorin acknowledges, it is hard to see Hobbes as supporting religious toleration (122), he does emphasize ways in which Hobbes’s view is not simply authoritarian.

Looking at the book as a whole, one might wonder just what the point of calling Hobbes a natural law philosopher is. Rather than seeing Hobbes as someone who rejects the natural law tradition, Zagorin sees him as a dissident member of that tradition, a natural law theorist who rejects many of the claims of other members of the tradition.

Hobbes was however notorious for his strategy of redefining key terms.1 Consider for instance the discussion of the passions in chapter 6 of Leviathan, the one that defines ‘religion’ as "Fear of power invisible, feigned by the mind, or imagined from tales publically allowed".2 As this approach is widespread in Hobbes’s work, one might well wonder whether Hobbes simply redefined ‘law of nature’ in a way that allowed him to use the term to describe something he believed in, while he did not actually believe in anything that anyone else would have called a law of nature.

Even if we get past that worry, we might well suspect that either description of Hobbes (as an unusual natural law theorist, or as a rejecter of natural law) is reasonable, so long the details and qualifications are sensible. After all, Hobbes did talk about laws of nature, but even Zagorin grants that Hobbes was no traditional natural law theorist. So it might seem that giving one description rather than the other doesn’t make much difference. Zagorin clearly sees his description as important though, if only because it emphasizes the ways in which Hobbes’s moral philosophy is a genuinely moral philosophy.

This relates to Zagorin’s repeated arguments against those who take Hobbes not to have a genuinely moral philosophy, those who think “that he had no theory of moral obligation and attributed all actions to self-interest” (100-1).3 Nagel, for instance argues "that genuine moral obligation plays no part in Leviathan at all, but that what Hobbes calls moral obligation is based exclusively on considerations of rational self-interest".4

Zagorin argues that such approaches must be wrong, because

the foundational concept of his [Hobbes’s] moral and political theory … was the law of nature, and he had no doubt that this law and the moral law were identical, that the natural law was a science of virtue and vice and of good and evil, and that its laws of human conduct deriving from reason were not only self- but other-regarding, affecting the conscience and promoting various traditional virtues in human beings (101).

Zagorin’s next way of putting his point is to grant that, for Hobbes, “human beings always act to satisfy their own desires” but to argue that they nevertheless do not “act solely for personal self-interest” or have “exclusively self-regarding” desires (101). Zagorin then makes a variety of further supporting points: he notes that people make sacrifices for others, and argues that Hobbes surely never denied this; he argues that self-interested motivation is not “inherently” anti-moral (102); he refers again to the idea that Hobbes is seeking a grounding for the law of nature (103); he notes the way Hobbes connects various laws of nature to virtues; etc.

One could however believe a great deal of that, and still believe that Hobbes thought people were motivated by self-interest. Much of what Zagorin says seems right, but maybe it doesn’t show as much as he thinks. To say that people are self-interested is not to say that they are selfish. So self-interest might include such things as doing things that will make you happy, when they make you happy because they make others happy.

The question remains whether one should say with Nagel that “genuine moral obligation” is absent in Leviathan. What exactly counts as “genuine moral obligation” might be largely a definitional matter, especially with that curious genuine lurking there. Still, we find on the one side Nagel arguing that Hobbes’s philosophy is one of self-interest, not morality. On the other side, Zagorin argues that Hobbes’s philosophy is genuinely moral, and is inclined to downplay the extent to which it is a philosophy of self-interest. There is a third option, however: to think that Hobbes’s philosophy is based on self-interest, and is genuinely moral.

I suspect that some of this debate depends on thinking that the third option isn’t really an option. But why think that? Zagorin at one point contrasts the approaches of Hobbes and Kant (104). If one begins from a Kantian perspective, one might well think that Hobbesian so-called moral philosophy isn’t really moral philosophy. Given a Kantian perspective, many (if not all) attempts to ground morality in self-interest will seem to be misguided, indeed to miss the point of morality. The influence of Kant tends to reinforce the notion that the realms of morality and self-interest must be entirely separate. But if you doubt the Kantian strict distinction, then there’s room to think, with Zagorin, that there’s a lot of morality in Hobbes, while also maintaining that Hobbes fundamentally does see people as driven by self-interest.5

Hobbes and the Law of Nature seems to have two general aims. One is to undermine common conceptions of Hobbes, as a philosopher who sees people as driven only by narrow self-interest, and as a philosopher concerned to defend the need for an unrestricted authoritarian power. A related aim is to emphasize the role of the law of nature in Hobbes’s work. One might question how much that emphasis really achieves, once we get past the initial important point of seeing how Hobbes presents his work in those terms. But the book does succeed in the other project of countering misconceptions, as it gives a rich picture of Hobbes’s moral and political thought.

1 On Hobbes’s use of this as a rhetorical strategy, see Philip Pettit, Made with Words: Hobbes on Language, Mind, and Politics (Princeton: Princeton UP, 2008) 53-4.

2 Thomas Hobbes, Leviathan, edited by Edwin Curley (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994) 6.36.

3 Zagorin refers explicitly to Gauthier and Nagel at this point, though the references are given to citations of Gauthier and Nagel in more recent works by Hampton and Lloyd (161, notes 6 and 7). This perhaps doesn’t mean much, except that Zagorin is not engaged in detail with any argument of Gauthier’s or Nagel’s.

4 Thomas Nagel, “Hobbes’s Concept of Obligation” Philosophical Review 68 (1959) 68-83, quoting 69.

5 This suggestion about Kant’s influence can’t be the whole story. Obviously it can’t explain anything about reactions of Hobbes’s contemporaries. But it might nevertheless explain something about more recent debates.