Hobbes, Locke, and Confusion's Masterpiece: An Examination of Seventeenth Century Philosophy

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Harrison, Ross, Hobbes, Locke, and Confusion's Masterpiece: An Examination of Seventeenth Century Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 288pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 052101719X.

Reviewed by Duncan Ivison, Princeton/University of Sydney


This extremely interesting and well-written book is billed as an “important new study of the foundations of modern political theory”. Authors probably shouldn’t be held responsible for their publisher’s blurbs, but this immediately raises a series of questions and expectations. What counts as a “foundation” in the first place, and how can reading Hobbes, Locke, Grotius and Pufendorf contribute to our grasp of these foundations? It also suggests something like Quentin Skinner’s project in his now classic Foundations of Modern Political Thought. For Skinner, the foundations of political thought were to be exposed historically in part to reveal their contingency—which didn’t necessarily mean they were arbitrary—and to help us see the connections between philosophical arguments and contestable claims to social power. Harrison’s project is more explicitly philosophical than Skinner’s, in the sense that he is less concerned with detailed reconstruction of contexts and problems of power. But his philosophical claims about foundations are also built on a historical thesis.

The title of the book is taken from Shakespeare’s Macbeth, and Macduff’s lament for the murder of King Duncan, the consequence of which is that “Confusion now have made his masterpiece!”. For Harrison, Shakespeare’s portrayal of the undermining of moral and political order provides a leitmotif for thinking about seventeenth century political philosophy in general. The greatest works of this century—here meaning those of Hobbes and Locke—emerged out of moral and political confusion. Religious disputes over the nature of belief and religious practice generated murderous civil and international conflict. Philosophical disputes, and especially the revival of ancient skepticism and newer forms of modern skepticism, sowed deep philosophical doubts about the possibility of knowledge, natural or otherwise. Older philosophical frameworks, such as Aristotelianism and Thomism, were found wanting, and philosophers struggled to find new arguments to arbitrate between various warring doctrines, or indeed to transcend them.

For Harrison, skepticism is the most pressing moral and political problem faced by seventeenth century philosophy, and especially by Hobbes and Locke. And the problem of skepticism infects “the most fundamental …problem in political philosophy” – the problem of political obligation (p. 13). At times Harrison seems to suggest these are still our problems, and that one way we gain insight into them is by seeing the various options for their resolution as presented by Hobbes, Locke, and Grotius, among others (pp. 4-5). We gain this kind of insight by taking the history of philosophy seriously, and especially the contexts within which moral and political arguments are formed. Not surprisingly, since these remain our problems, Hobbes emerges as the most clear-headed in this history since he seems most willing to bite the bullet when it comes to the clash between self-interest, politics and morality (263-4). We need politics (the commonwealth) to solve the moral problem, given his subjectivist account of what is good and bad and of moral judgment. In a lovely aside, Harrison tells us that at one point he contemplated calling the last chapter “What’s the Use?” in order to “reflect more generally on the possibility of political philosophy and on the use for political philosophy of the historical philosophers I have been describing” (p. 245; the chapter is actually called “Why Utility Pleases’). His answer to this question is rather elusive, but I take it that it is Hobbes” insight about the need for politics to help solve our moral conflicts that Harrison is suggesting is the master stroke of the “new” natural law. This and the various attempts at refuting Hobbes” argument, such as Cumberland’s, point to the “beginnings of the contractualist method” of discovering the good by discovering those things into which everyone would contract (262). Harrison even suggests that Locke gestures at something like it in his 1692 note “Ethica A” (263). But in another much bleaker note written the following year (which Harrison doesn’t cite), Locke suggests that without God and his divine law what we get is moral chaos. Harrison admits that Locke is only “waving” at something about which Hobbes is much clearer.

As it stands, the main claims of the book are hardly novel. The central focus on skepticism fits into a pattern of thinking about the history of the seventeenth century that has its roots in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy, and which has been central to the work of historians of philosophy like Richard Popkin, amongst others. Richard Tuck and Knud Haakonssen have also argued recently at great length and with great skill that the political thought of the seventeenth century—especially that of Hobbes and Grotius—was profoundly shaped by the challenge of skepticism mounted by writers such as Montaigne and Charron. But what is interesting about the book, at least for me, is the way it tries to balance historical and philosophical approaches to these questions in a manner not often attempted in the existing literature. To over-generalize somewhat, historically minded scholars often provide beautiful reconstructions of the context of an argument or period, but avoid asking the kinds of philosophical questions that inevitably emerge as one reflects on the relation between arguments then and now. On the other hand, and much more frequently, contemporary philosophers tend to wrench early modern arguments out of context altogether, and criticize or put them to work in modern guise without any hesitation whatsoever. Harrison tries to strike a balance between these two extremes, and it provides an interesting background for the work as a whole.

Let me say a bit more about this tension as a way of thinking about Harrison’s discussion of normativity, which strikes me as lying at the heart of the book. Sometimes the history of philosophy is seen as a series of pale approximations building up to what we now know to be true. The history of early modern philosophy is particularly prone to this kind of distortion. Referring to the period beginning from the seventeenth century up to the French Revolution as the “Age of Enlightenment” only reinforces such a tendency. At some very general level it’s undoubtedly true that this is an age of progress and genuine intellectual enlightenment. But just as many questions are raised as answered by taking on too sweeping a vision of this narrative. For one thing, it turns out that there isn’t just one “Enlightenment” but many - early and late, “high” and “low’, radical and conservative, English and continental, etc. (see, for example, the work of Jonathan Israel, Tim Hochstrasser and Ian Hunter). Second, it is not even clear that we should assume that what we mean by philosophy today is what philosophers in the seventeenth century understood themselves to be doing. A basic assumption governing much of the writing of the history of philosophy since Kant has been that a theory of knowledge is at the core of philosophy (call it the “epistemological paradigm’, a phrase I borrow from Knud Haakonssen). Early modern philosophy seems to confirm this development, and especially the role played by someone like John Locke and his Essay Concerning Human Understanding. The struggle against skepticism defines the project of philosophy from the seventeenth century onwards. Thus political philosophy is either a form of “applied philosophy’, meaning the working out of various meta-ethical claims in different practical contexts, or it is a domain in which claims about morality are irrelevant, or at least ineffective. Philosophy is about justification, and political philosophy is either no different or it is not philosophy.

Now Harrison argues that political philosophy has essentially three tasks (247-252). First, the task of explanation, that is, “promoting understanding of political aspects of our (social) world”. Second, the “task of justification … we want to know why or whether we should have it, or in what way’, and in this sense political philosophy is a normative subject, “a part of applied ethics” (247). Third, it must explain motivation, that is, why people are or could be motivated to “produce” the desired outcomes or institutions. These various aspects can come apart and combine in various ways, as Harrison shows very nicely with regard to both Hobbes and Locke. But the crucial task for political philosophy is justification – in fact, the need for justification is entailed by the confusion caused by skepticism, and the responses by Hobbes and Locke are “masterpieces of justification” (252). The structure of justification that Harrison presupposes goes something like this. Rationally binding norms are either self-grounding, on the basis of some account of self-interest, moral realism, or a conception of man as a rational self-governing being, or they bind in virtue of the superior wisdom and/or power of God. Seventeenth century political philosophy is then taken to be a series of variations on these themes, and mainly variations of the latter. Hobbes is the exception that proves the rule, and that is why he seems most clear-headed from our modern perspective.

The dual commitment of Harrison’s project is striking here. On the one hand, he wants to provide an historically sensitive account of the arguments of people like Hobbes, Grotius, Pufendorf, Locke, Cumberland and others. And on the other hand, he is arguing that the search for the foundations in political thought is best understood as a problem of philosophical justification, understood basically in terms of what I called the “epistemological paradigm”. To be fair, he also talks about the important role of explanation and of motivation, but his main concerns are epistemological. How can we know the content of the natural law? On what grounds do we know it and in what sense does it bind? This reflects a deep ambiguity lying at the heart of Protestant natural law theory in general; the worry that if there was no moral continuity between Man and God, then it wasn’t clear how reason could establish any link between man’s behaviour and God’s reward or punishment. So justification is obviously central to what Hobbes or Locke thought they were doing. But if our conception of justification is too narrow, then we risk leaving out an enormous amount out of what counted as political philosophy in the seventeenth century—or as philosophy in general, for that matter. Harrison’s off-hand remark that Spinoza is not a “normative thinker” and is “descriptive in intention all the way down” (p. 252) is astonishing in this regard (especially in light of much recent work on Spinoza). Moreover it is a missed opportunity for a discussion of the different senses of “the normative” in seventeenth century political philosophy, outside of the confines of the way we understand it today—a way deeply shaped by Kant, it seems to me. This is not only a point about history. One thing the history of political thought can do is help loosen the grip of seeing our current way of using our normative concepts, as bequeathed to us by our intellectual heritage, as the only way. This is probably asking Harrison to do something that falls outside the bounds of his stated project, but I was led to think about it in the course of reading his book.

Thus, Samuel Pufendorf, in his De officio hominis et civis, conceived of man in the civil sphere as neither a self-obligating (and thus self-governing) rational being, nor as under obligation in virtue of some higher and divine moral force. Instead (as Ian Hunter and David Saunders have argued recently) he was attempting to reconstruct politics along the lines of a kind of “civic ethics” that could free the civil authorities of the territorial states in the new Westphalian world of Northern Europe from destabilizing disputes over what counts as the truly “higher” authority. And he did so, in part, by applying the distinctive moral idiom of “office” to his analysis of the concept of duty in the civil sphere, something Harrison doesn’t discuss and which is very different from moral theology or positive law (cf. 158-60) but still rooted very much in the context of seventeenth century arguments about politics. Second, and more generally, justification of belief was not the only way in which normative concerns were pursued in early modern philosophy. For example, the role of ad hominem argument and the “exemplary” philosophical life (e.g. Bayle’s portrayal of Spinoza), have no role in Harrison’s story, despite their prominence in early modern arguments. Being open to these different ideas of the normative is important for grasping the absolute centrality in seventeenth century debates over the nature of history—both sacred and profane—which involve conceptions of knowledge that sit very uncomfortably with their modern counterparts. Hence debates over the interpretation of Scripture, and the messianic nature of some forms of Protestant theology (such as Locke’s), shaped various normative political claims in ways at odds with the epistemological paradigm. In fact, Harrison is quite aware of the challenges this raises for the task of justification in politics (see especially pp. 186-8, 254, 255-7).

The book is replete with intelligent and very clear discussions of various problems familiar to readers of Hobbes and Locke. Harrison displays an excellent grasp of the wide range of texts that Hobbes and Locke wrote, as well as some of the surrounding texts to which they were responding and arguing with. He is also capable of putting various modern debates into helpful relief. Thus we get a careful discussion of the limits to which Hobbes’s account of the state of nature represents a genuine version of the prisoner’s dilemma as modeled by contemporary game theorists, one that combines both conceptual analysis and careful attention to historical context (96-100, 113). The foundation of Locke’s conception of natural rights is distinguished from the use Nozick makes of it (253-5). Harrison also makes an inspired use of Hobbes’s distinction between “counsel” and “command” to help make sense of the ways the laws of nature are meant to oblige (pp. 81-92). There is an excellent discussion of the relation between will and consent in both Hobbes and Locke (126-129; 200-209). And there is a careful discussion of Locke’s theory of property, which again asks the right kind of philosophical questions about the nature and incidents of property, but also with a view to the theological and practical contexts in which Locke’s argument was embedded (219-238). Finally and more generally, as I’ve already mentioned, Harrison is extremely sensitive to the kinds of question readers of these texts are prone to ask today: what would happen if we dropped God from the picture? What work does God, or at least various theological premises, do in these arguments? To what extent can we make sense of these arguments outside of these theological premises? For all these reasons and more, Harrison’s book is a very welcome addition to the literature on seventeenth century political philosophy.