Hobbes & Political Contractarianism: Selected Writings

Hobbes Political Contractarianism

David Gauthier, Hobbes & Political Contractarianism: Selected Writings, Susan Dimock, Claire Finkelstein, and Christopher W. Morris (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2022, 263pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192843005.

Reviewed by Andrew I. Cohen, Georgia State University


This splendid collection draws together and adds to David Gauthier’s works on political morality since Morals by Agreement. Of the one dozen essays, ten have previously been published. One appears here in English for the first time. Two chapters are new. The republished pieces reward renewed study, especially for tracking the evolution of Gauthier’s thought across topics such as authorization and the law. The new pieces provide fresh insights on interpreting and applying Hobbes’s views.

Early chapters show Gauthier closely engaging Gregory Kavka and Jean Hampton on sovereignty, egoism, and authorization. Authorization proves an important theme throughout many essays in the book. It is the key, Gauthier says, for understanding how subjects change the structure of “normative space,” which is the domain of reasons and justifications.

In “Thomas Hobbes and the Contractarian Theory of Law,” Gauthier debunks the notion that Hobbes was a sort of Austinian positivist. The normativity of law rests in an obligation, which must come from our agreement (54). Law’s binding force is not then merely a function of power. Gauthier also explores trends in Hobbes’s political works about what that prior obligation to obey the law might be. Key is the emergence of (and our reasons to endorse) a public standard of reason, which “supplants” private reason (58). This Hobbesian public reason is the topic of chapter 10, reprinted here and which occasioned fruitful commentary elsewhere.

In several of the essays, Gauthier notes the Hobbesian sovereign cannot be the unconstrained beast of caricatures. Though each subject authorizes the sovereign’s reason to displace private judgment, “each may and indeed must use his private reason to determine what the public reason is” (67). Indeed, Leviathan, Gauthier notes, is just such an exercise.

Gauthier grapples with the normative status of the laws of nature. In chapters 4 and 5, for instance, he tracks important differences among Hobbes’s political works, including contrasts between the English and Latin versions of Leviathan. Perhaps such laws are simply “theorems” (as Hobbes claimed in Lev XV), which would mean they are not properly laws. As theorems, they would not bind. Alternatively, they might bind in virtue of some command. Who commands them? There are problems with treating God or the sovereign as the commander. At least in chapter 5 (first published in 2001), Gauthier thought it best to regard the laws of nature as theorems indicating what we must do to live in peace and prosperity.

In chapter 4, and, new in this volume, chapter 8 (“Authors and Actors”), Gauthier considers the problem punishment poses for any interpretation of Hobbesian authorization and sovereignty. As Hobbes notes (Lev XIV.9), persons cannot set aside rights to resist those who intend them grievous harm or imprisonment because no good can come of it. On the other hand, we supposedly authorize all that the sovereign does. There is also a conceptual barrier to authorizing punishment: there is no right to punish in the state of nature, since punishment is harm inflicted by some “publique Authority” for an act or omission the authority designates a breach of the law (Lev XXVIII.1). Gauthier resolves the tension by arguing that we have reason to authorize an institutional structure of punishment, but we might still be permitted (and have reason) to resist such punishments when we are the targets. Chapter 8 also highlights some of the ways Gauthier has revised his earlier account of the significance of right reason. Here he takes authorization as better illuminating the relationship of the sovereign’s will to that of the subjects. Each authorizes the other. This “dual relationship” is a distinctive feature of Hobbes’s theory. We get a genuine union of subjects under a sovereign will.

Chapter 6, “Hobbes on Sovereign Authority,” features Gauthier exploring the structure of Hobbesian “normative space.” This is part of considering how Hobbes moves from the unlimited permission of the right of nature to a sovereign will. The right of nature serves as a “moral primitive” for Hobbes (102). It gives an “initial structure on normative space” akin to the good will in Kant’s Groundwork (101–102). Gauthier explores the number, structure, and role of “normative primitives.” These are “considerations that serve as justifiers without needing justification” (102; see also 157). In earlier writings, Gauthier thought the right of nature was the only normative primitive. The unlimited permission it sets out generates the familiar conflict of the state of war. Agents escape that by applying their respective rights of nature. They must enact “a change in the contours of their moral space” (103). The sovereign public reason they constitute through agreement is right not by corresponding to some independent standard of right reason. There is none. Instead, it is right because it is final.

Taking the right of nature as the sole normative primitive entails some costs. Those outside the agreement (foreigners, the disabled, nonhuman animals) may seem beyond the protection of justice. (This theme recurs in chapters 11 and 12, where Gauthier considers to whom justice applies.) Nevertheless, there are gestures in Leviathan toward another normative primitive in the laws of nature. Adding another primitive would provide reasons that rival those of the unlimited right of nature. Hobbes does not explore that possibility.

In chapter 7, Gauthier takes up that banner as part of a new reply to skeptics of reasons for justice. In “The True and Only Moral Philosophy,” newly published here, Gauthier offers a careful interpretation of chapters 13–15 of Leviathan. Gauthier considers trends among Hobbes’s political writings about the sources of conflict, the possibilities of covenants in the state of nature, as well as reasons to establish and abide by a sovereign public reason. Chapter 7 is of special interest for Gauthier’s account of the “contours of normative space” (135). The “normative world” is “sharply bifurcated” (135). The laws of nature turn out to be alternate normative primitives unto themselves. They can provide their own reasons.

Along comes the Foole, who challenges the claim that reason always supports justice. Hobbes’s reply has generated much discussion, including previously by Gauthier. We might say with Hobbes that the Foole reasons poorly in civil society: effective sovereigns ensure that. In the state of nature, however, what is the Foole’s error?

Gauthier argues on Hobbes’s behalf that the Foole reasons poorly, even by the Foole’s own lights: “Individual benefit is greater among covenant keepers than breakers” (140). Of course, there is more to say. Reason sometimes suggests benefit from grifting, deception, and all manner of skullduggery. Gauthier tries to buttress Hobbes’s reply by pointing to what reasonable people believe. “A reasonable person, recognizing that every person benefits from peace [. . .] will therefore judge that he has reason to keep his covenants, if he may expect others to do the same” (141). This might overstate the case, since the Foole sees the benefits of deception and parasitism. Perhaps it is no great loss to let the Foole win this one. Sufficient stability and the benefits of commodious living might be possible even if we cannot provide the Foole a convincing argument that reason always requires keeping one’s word. (Some fine social science considers stability tipping points on such matters.)

Gauthier will not give in to the Foole so easily. He notes, “The Foole has no conception of cooperation” (141). The Foole misses the gains that might be available from shifting to a new way of thinking about what there is reason to do. On Gauthier’s account, what the Foole misses is how covenants change the structure of reasons in our normative space. Covenants generate reasons “that cannot be identified with or reduced to reasons of advantage” (144). Whether the Foole recognizes such reasons is another matter, and presumably we will need institutions that give such reasons “motivational appeal” (144). This would take us into political theory, which Gauthier says is not the subject of his discussion in this chapter (144). Gauthier’s point, however, is that when persons covenant, that just is their creating reasons that “should override self-interest in their deliberations” (144). The Foole is then missing the force of another normative primitive—one independent of, and not reducible to, considerations of advantage.

On Gauthier’s account, the laws of nature are a window into another realm of normative primitives. Not all reasons then are reasons of benefit. The laws of nature set out a space for persons “who appreciate the benefits of cooperation” (157). Recognizing there is more than one normative primitive allows for another “mode of deliberation” (157). It is unclear what is new with this different mode. Is it the raw material with which one deliberates, or the very structure of deliberation, or both, or something else? Presumably the laws of nature, insofar as they are normative primitives, furnish reasons that can obstruct reasons of benefit. If so, they can be assessed alongside other reasons. It then seems the Foole’s problem is not a mistake. In only seeing reasons of benefit, the Foole suffers from a sort of normative incapacity.

W.K. Frankena once considered the possibility that critics of Moorean intuitionism might, at most, suffer from a sort of moral “blindness, analogous to colour-blindness” that keeps them from seeing the moral properties Moore discussed (1939, 475). Frankena added that the intuitionists might instead suffer “from a corresponding moral hallucination” (1939, 475). If Gauthier is correct about there being more than one normative primitive, then the Foole is guilty of no error of reasoning. The more normatively enlightened might simply pity the Foole. The Foole simply does not get it. Their pity is not a reason to let down their guard. Such partial normative incapacity might indicate Hobbesians should offer another reply to the Foole—one that shifts the discussion away from appeals to benefit. Their appeals may strike the Foole as ultimately mysterious—in a way analogous to how color talk might seem to the completely color blind.

Whether Gauthier hallucinates or the Foole is blind, peace and stability might nevertheless be possible with institutions that reliably secure compliance, plus provision of education to nurture normative imagination. Perhaps there is a reason for the Foole to convert to recognizing other sources of normativity, even when this might illuminate reasons that defeat or displace considerations of benefit.

Those who balk at committed romantic relationships or having and rearing children might worry about changing the structure of their “normative space.” They are wary of entering those relationships. It would change the reasons that apply to them. They worry they might come to want to give up prospective benefits. Depending on our conception of “benefit” and our notion of “reason,” there might yet be a good reason to take on these commitments, even if the change involves tradeoffs. Taking a cue from Gregory Kavka (1985), it might still be a good idea to enter a relationship where one might take a bullet, literally or figuratively, and willingly, for a loved one. There might be reason to acknowledge fates worse than death. There might be reasons beyond “apparent benefit” (Lev XV.15).

This is Gauthier’s point. Recalcitrant Fooles are missing the force of reasons that are not about benefits. On the other hand, the Fooles might be right: sometimes, on some assessments of the reasons that apply to a person, it might be a good idea not to keep the covenants one makes. Whether one should want to be the sort of person who takes normative space as exhausted by considerations of benefit is another question that might not be answerable simply by appealing to reasons of benefit.

This chapter does not engage recent Hobbes scholarship. Gauthier says as much. He sees himself in dialogue with Hobbes and invites us to listen. It would be even more illuminating to hear how Gauthier would reply to some recent related work (including, but certainly not limited to, works by S.A. Lloyd and Arash Abizadeh) with the care and detail he showed to Kavka and Hampton. We can only ask so much in a volume such as this.

Appearing in English for the first time is chapter 11, “The Best of Times (Universality, Individuality, and Democracy).” The essay celebrates several scientific, public health, and cultural innovations linked to the stunning material improvements most people welcome. Gauthier takes liberal individualist pluralism as the basis for such improvements. Critics will surely challenge the causal account here as overbroad. Gauthier originally wrote the essay at the turn of the millennium. In an intriguing footnote new to this publication, Gauthier adds, “This essay could not be written today” (216 n. 1). It is not entirely clear why. The essay came at a time when communism had largely collapsed, tyranny and autocracy seemed on the wane, standards of living were headed up, infant mortality was down, life spans were increasing, and liberalism had seemingly triumphed. What has changed in the intervening 20+ years? It is unclear if Gauthier worries about a sort of liberal chauvinism or the collective action problem from our fossil-fuel-powered world. He points to “the possibility of an irreversibly scorched and polluted planet” (216 n.1). Whether there is an irreversible scorching is significantly an empirical question but also a substantive one about what scorching consists in and what distributions of burdens and benefits from fossil fuel consumption are publicly justifiable. Perhaps the liberal order Gauthier (only previously?) celebrated might foster the innovation needed to address climate concerns. It is unclear in any case that accountable governments under rule of law, voluntarism in human relations, norms of private property, and tolerance are no longer key ingredients for a flourishing civil society.

The volume concludes with a reprinted essay, “A Society of Individuals,” based on a talk Gauthier gave in 2011 at a York University conference to commemorate the 25th anniversary of Morals by Agreement. Gauthier sets out further details about the hypothetical agreement by which to understand justified norms of political morality. There is to be a single standard of right. It is one on which we can agree, not from behind any Rawlsian veil of ignorance, but while knowing our “capacities and interests” (236). This society of individuals is one on which reasonable people can be drawn to agreement. While it is not as robust a basis of agreement as in Rawls, this modus vivendi political community offers a basis for (nearly) all of us to live decent lives and get along well with one another.

Gauthier and the editors have provided a collection that illuminates much about Hobbes and much about the evolution of Gauthier’s thought. The essays here consider features of a normatively sufficient, plausible, and stable contractarian political morality (224). Gauthier’s work continues to provide rich insights for scholars of Hobbes and political philosophy.


W.K. Frankena, “The Naturalistic Fallacy,” Mind 48, no. 192 (1939): 475.

Gregory S. Kavka, “The Reconciliation Project,” in Morality, Reason and Truth (Totowa, N.J: Rowman and Allanheld, 1985), 279–319