Hobbesian Applied Ethics and Public Policy

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Shane D. Courtland (ed.), Hobbesian Applied Ethics and Public Policy, Routledge, 2018, 293 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138691636.

Reviewed by Robin Douglass, King's College London


In the introduction to this wide-ranging collection, Shane D. Courtland observes that while philosophers such as Immanuel Kant, Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill are routinely invoked in applied ethics and public policy debates, 'the Hobbesian project has been largely missing' (p. 1). The volume comprises fifteen chapters addressing a variety of problems in applied ethics, with the goal of redressing this neglect and offering 'not only a fresh take regarding those problems, but also a fresh take regarding Hobbes' (p. 2). In this review, I briefly outline the arguments of each chapter before evaluating the extent to which the volume contributes to our understanding of both Hobbes and debates in applied ethics.

The first section, 'Core Issues in Application,' opens with Susanne Sreedhar's defence of a Hobbesian approach to public policy. The chapter serves as a helpful and more extensive introduction to the volume by highlighting a range of issues, from the rule of law to taxation and social welfare, where Hobbes offers public policy proposals that may seem attractive to 'liberal progressives' (p. 12). Sreedhar considers why Hobbes has often been excluded from debates in applied ethics, before defending 'a distinct Hobbesian approach to applied philosophy' (p. 23), which is informed by empirical evidence and avoids appealing to controversial value judgements that others might not share.

The other two chapters in the first section draw inspiration from contractarian or contractualist interpretations of Hobbes. The contribution by Daniel Eggers will be of interest to those who read Hobbes as 'an advocate of both political and ethical contractarianism' (p. 28). Eggers assumes, rather than argues for, the plausibility of the latter, which makes sense, given that his focus is as much on the Hobbesian approaches of David Gauthier and Peter Stemmer as it is on Hobbes himself. Eggers maintains that Hobbesian contractarianism is unable to provide a satisfactory defence of fundamental moral rights for disabled people, children and animals, due to the overly narrow conception of self-interest motivating the (hypothetical) contracting parties. Eva Odzuck adapts an argument first made by Jean Hampton to show that there is a logical contradiction at the heart of Hobbes's theory. On the one hand, individuals cannot give up the right of self-preservation when entering the covenant that institutes a commonwealth, but, on the other hand, it is the sovereign who defines what counts as a matter of self-preservation, life or death. This discrepancy, Odzuck argues, imperils the sovereign's legitimacy over questions of bio-policy.

The second section, 'Medical Ethics,' is the most clearly demarcated of the five. It begins with Rosamond Rhodes challenging the dominant view of medical ethics as an application of ordinary morality to medical practice. She instead outlines sixteen distinctive laws of medical ethics based on Hobbes's 'contractarian constructivist' approach to formulating the laws of nature (p. 69). Joanne Boucher's chapter turns to the topic of physician-assisted suicide and argues that Hobbes's materialist philosophy provides a strong basis for defending the practice. While this might seem in tension with his focus on self-preservation, Boucher maintains that the emphasis Hobbes places on securing a flourishing life for all would make it rational to choose suicide over a life of unbearable suffering. In the final chapter of the section, Marcus P. Adams constructs a Hobbesian framework for understanding the importance of informed consent in medicine. Adams analyses Hobbes's account of maker's knowledge and argues that, rather than being passive recipients of information, prospective patients would have to undergo some sort of simulation of what it would be like to live with a certain condition following surgery before being able to give informed consent.

The third section, 'Local Issues,' commences with Kody W. Cooper defending a prolife interpretation of Hobbes's views on abortion. Cooper argues that, for Hobbes, life begins at generation (i.e. conception), and that the golden rule formulation of the law of nature rules out abortion, as this would involve doing to others what one would not wish done to oneself. In a more light-hearted chapter, Michael Krom sets Hobbes's views on alcohol out against a tradition of reflecting on drinking from Socrates to Montaigne. Krom's most intriguing thesis is that Hobbes's narrow conception of reason leads him to neglect the positive aspects of alcohol consumption that the older tradition had appreciated: opening 'up the soul to the pursuit of truth' by removing social inhibitions, and transcending reason by accessing a state 'of divine madness or drunkenness' (p. 154). In the final chapter of the section, Elanor Curran shows that Hobbes's refutation of natural hierarchy, along with his various arguments for equality of rights and treatment, could easily be extended to support the case for equal marriage rights. Curran is cautious to avoid suggesting that Hobbes himself endorsed same-sex marriage, although she does point to his correspondence with Fran├žois de Verdus for some suggestive evidence that it may not have troubled him.

The fourth section, 'Political Issues,' begins with David van Mill arguing that Hobbes has a broadly liberal theory of free speech. Against those who infer totalitarian implications from Hobbes's absolutism, van Mill shows that absolutism does not commit Hobbes to any specific position on free speech and that the emphasis of his proposals for combatting seditious opinions falls more on improving education than on censoring opinions. Jan Narveson's playful chapter advances a libertarian reading of Hobbes, arguing that his basic theory does not permit the welfare state. On Narveson's reading, Hobbes's fundamental law of nature -- seek peace when we have the hope of obtaining it -- obliges all individuals to avoid harming others, but not to actively help them. The welfare state, then, which redistributes from the rich to the poor, apparently contravenes the fundamental law of nature, and should be deemed unacceptable. The section closes with Tom Sorell arguing that chapter 27 of Leviathan provides insights for thinking through the seriousness of different forms of crime. Sorell criticises prominent liberal theories of serious crime for being too one-sided, as they are principally concerned with the harm suffered by the victim, whereas Hobbes's focus is instead on the extent to which crime undermines the institutions of the state. Drawing insights from Hobbes, then, indicates the way forward for a more rounded hybrid theory of serious crime.

The final section is vaguely titled 'Group Pluralism and Public Policy.' Jeremy Anderson's chapter reconstructs a Hobbesian response to terrorism based on an analysis of the general causes of sedition and disorder that Hobbes identifies. The core of this response would be preventative and aimed at rooting out the causes of terrorism, such as erroneous beliefs and discontent. This preventative and educational approach, Anderson suggests, stands in marked contrast to the punitive and reactive approach taken by recent US presidents. Peter Vanderschraaf turns to the question of dissent. He draws a distinction between covenant-dissenters and submission-dissenters, before arguing that, in practice, a Hobbesian sovereign's best policy may be to tolerate and protect the latter. In the book's final chapter, Gabrielle Stanton examines the analogy between a domestic and international state of nature. She presents Hobbes as a critic of imperialism and, drawing on his discussion of the seeds of religion, stresses the importance of ideological as well as geographical boundaries for theorising a Hobbesian approach to international relations.

With this brief survey of the chapters complete, the question remains whether the volume succeeds, on its own terms, in offering perceptive interpretations of Hobbes's thought and drawing insights for applied ethics or public policy. To my mind, there are only four chapters where a strong case can be made to say that both criteria are satisfied. Two of these are the chapters on serious crime and terrorism. Although Sorell only discusses one contemporary theory of serious crime, his analysis is crystal clear about precisely what Hobbes brings to the table that could improve the theory in question. Sorell recognises that there are problems with Hobbes's account, but he nonetheless shows that there are important insights that can be distilled from it to inform contemporary debates. Similarly, the implications of Anderson's analysis of Hobbes for thinking through terrorism are clear and relevant, although I am less sure whether the focus on preventative measures really brings anything new to academic debates about how to address terrorism, even if his criticisms of existing practice are germane.

Arguably, the two most impressive chapters are those by Curran and Sreedhar, in part because they reflect carefully on the difficulties of drawing contemporary insights from Hobbes. Curran's chapter, in particular, is marked by a healthy dose of circumspection, from which some other chapters would benefit and which should be the norm as soon as we ask questions that take the form: what would Hobbes have thought about X given that he never actually addressed X? One of the virtues of Curran's chapter is that she clearly distinguishes the question of whether Hobbes offers arguments that could be used to defend equal marriage from the question of Hobbes's own attitude towards equal marriage.

Sreedhar's chapter also displays an admirably nuanced approach. In explaining why Hobbes is often excluded from debates in applied ethics, she suggests that this might be because even his most attractive policies are not grounded on fundamental liberal values. What at first blush might seem like a weakness, however, turns out to be a strength. Hobbes's 'value minimalism' and 'emphasis on peace and stability as the prime political values' means that he may be well placed to contribute to debates characterised by deep moral disagreement (p. 23). This suggestion stands in marked contrast to other chapters where, for example, Hobbesian contractarianism is criticised for leading to 'views on euthanasia, environmental protection, cloning or factory farming that the majority of us would deem morally inappropriate' (p. 28). The assumption that the majority of us are in agreement about any of these questions seems to show a jarring disregard for political reality, and it is precisely in such cases that the Hobbesian approach Sreedhar advocates might be able to cut through at least some of the moral disagreement that characterises real-world politics.

If these are the volume's most successful chapters, where do other chapters fall short? In a couple of cases, the chapters engage effectively with debates in applied ethics, but it is less clear that Hobbes is bringing anything new to these debates. I had this misgiving, at least to some extent, with the laws of medical ethics that Rhodes sets out. Even if they reflect 'the spirit of his ethics' (p. 70), her insights did not seem distinctively Hobbesian, especially in so far as they conform to the Golden Rule of morality, which Hobbes was by no means alone in endorsing. Something similar could be said of Boucher's defence of physician-assisted suicide, for surely one does not need to be a Hobbesian (or a materialist) to accept that a life of unbearable suffering is worse than death. In other cases, Hobbes's ideas seem to be distorted a little too much to fit the position being defended. For example, while Adams's discussion of maker's knowledge is itself illuminating, it is far from evident that Hobbes placed such stringent epistemological demands on what counts as legitimate consent.[1]

A more serious problem, given the aims of the volume, is that many of the chapters contribute very little to debates in applied ethics or public policy, even if they advance interesting interpretations of Hobbes. For example, contemporary scholarship on free speech (in the case of van Mill), the legalisation or decriminalisation of drugs (Krom), or civil disobedience (Vanderschraaf) receives no, or minimal, attention. In other cases, the contemporary debates are mischaracterised in a way that over-simplifies the contribution that Hobbes is supposed to offer. In the chapter on abortion, for instance, Cooper claims that 'the prochoice view premises the moral quality of the right to choose abortion on the nonpersonhood of the aborted entity' (p. 131). But this overlooks one of the main justifications of the prochoice view, which focuses on the mother's right to decide what happens to her own body while granting, at least for the sake of argument, that foetuses are persons with rights.[2] Neglecting this seems a considerable oversight given Hobbes's position that, by the right of nature, all individuals can use their power as they judge for their own preservation. This is not to suggest that Hobbes would necessarily have supported a woman's right to bodily autonomy, but merely that it would have helped to consider how his arguments could be employed on the other side of the debate. Indeed, this is one of several cases where dialogue between different chapters in the volume could have proved beneficial. In this case, Cooper and Eggers disagree sharply on the rights that Hobbes grants foetuses and children, but neither seems aware of the considerations that the other raises.

Overall, then, this volume contains some essays that will be of interest to Hobbes scholars, and some, although fewer, that will be of interest to scholars working in applied ethics. But only a few chapters can plausibly be said to offer a fresh take on both Hobbes's thought and contemporary debates in applied ethics and public policy.

[1] For further discussion, see Kinch Hoekstra, 'The de facto Turn in Hobbes's Political Philosophy,' in Leviathan After 350 Years, ed. Tom Sorell and Luc Foisneau (Clarendon Press, 2004), especially 68-73.

[2] This is the starting point, for example, of Judith Jarvis Thomson's seminal article, 'A Defense of Abortion,' Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1:1 (1971), 47-66.