Devin Stauffer offers a brilliant and controversial esoteric interpretation of Hobbes's attack on religion, and relates it to Hobbes's metaphysics, natural philosophy, and politics/ethics. Although Hobbes apparently tries to show that religion is consistent with his ethics and politics, Stauffer sees religious belief as Hobbes's 'most fundamental foe' (193). His 'desire to undermine religion' led to 'moral teaching that . . . is more likely to draw men away from belief than toward it' (236). The ultimate aim is not just to 'rationalize' Christianity by removing superstition, but to foster 'a far-reaching and comprehensive enlightenment' (272).
My praise of this Straussian interpretation will surprise some readers, given that I have published a paper called 'Anti-Strauss' (Blau 2012; see Blau 2015b for corrections and extensions). But I only criticised the low quality of Strauss's esoteric interpretations, not esoteric interpretation in general. Many philosophers seem to have written esoterically (Bagley 1992; Melzer 2014).
Moreover, an esoteric reading of Hobbes's religious views is entirely possible. We know that Hobbes was at the very least a deeply unorthodox Christian. According to John Aubrey, Hobbes said that he 'durst not speak so boldly' as Spinoza: perhaps Hobbes's actual religious views were even more heretical than his expressed ones. Since his expressed views got him in serious trouble, it would be no surprise if he hid more heretical thoughts, and it is conceivable that he sought to subtly undermine faith in religion while writing with plausible deniability.
Stauffer's esoteric interpretations are far better defended than Strauss's. Stauffer avoids Strauss's crazy techniques such as counting names and numbers, or looking in the middle of chapters, texts or sets of examples. What Stauffer takes from Strauss is the idea that Hobbes dare not be explicit about problems of religion and the Bible, and instead slyly indicates these problems by drawing attention to them in various ways. (A typology of these different techniques of hinting would help readers, incidentally.)
One esoteric technique that Stauffer attributes to Hobbes involves making a poor defence of X, to hint that X is actually indefensible. For example, the New Testament in general, and Jesus in particular, often treat spirits as real. Hobbes, who is adamant that spirits cannot be real, tries to explain away these comments, but perceptive readers will see that these 'explanations' are weak, infer that the New Testament and Jesus really did treat spirits as real, and conclude that the New Testament seems dubious and Jesus looks like a spiritualist (96-8).
Stauffer shows a strong grasp of the secondary literature and an outstanding grasp of Hobbes's own writings, including revealing comparisons of the original Leviathan and the Latin translation, published in 1651 and 1668 respectively. Moreover, Stauffer deftly combines analysis of Hobbes's metaphysics, natural philosophy, religion, and politics/ethics. Many scholars make contributions in one of those areas, some in two or three, but it is rare to do all four, especially so effectively.
All Hobbes scholars will thus benefit from reading this book, and even those who reject Stauffer's esoteric hypothesis, or who (like me) are not yet convinced, will find insights on many pages, as well as passages in Hobbes which need rethinking. Stauffer's writing is beautifully clear, although his habit of asking rhetorical questions about Hobbes's intentions gets tiresome after a while.
Chapter 1 examines Hobbes's attack on 'vain philosophy', the Aristotelian scholasticism that dominated universities. The most important part is the discussion of Hobbes's attack on contemporary metaphysics and its relationship to politics (22-29). Chapter 2 tackles Hobbes's natural philosophy -- his mechanistic materialism, which was 'anathema to everything the scholastics stood for' (41).
But the book takes off in chapter 3, when Stauffer turns to religion. Although Hobbes depicts his reason-based politics/ethics as consistent with the Bible, Stauffer doubts Hobbes's sincerity, because Hobbes's Scriptural interpretation is 'so heterodox and even at times outlandish' (85). For Stauffer, the irreligious implications of Hobbes's interpretations were tacit pointers for perceptive readers (e.g. 91).
A particularly exciting aspect of chapter 3 is that Stauffer shows the irreligiousness not only of the second half of Leviathan, dedicated to religion, but even of the passing comments about religion in the first half of Leviathan. The 'opening salvo' of Hobbes's critique of religion is found in chapter 2 of Leviathan, when 'Hobbes inconspicuously weaves into his account of dreams and apparitions an attack on certain interpretations of these experiences' (89). Hobbes might seem merely to be fighting a 'guerrilla war' against superstition, but there are good reasons to think that his target was religion more generally (93).
Chapter 4 moves to Hobbes's own religious views. Perhaps the key claim is that Hobbes was deflating efforts to prove the existence of God (117-26). Whether or not one agrees with this, Stauffer does a fine job of showing that Hobbes highlights the 'very great limits' of the knowledge reason can produce (125).
Chapter 5 examines 'Hobbes's confrontation with the Bible' (127). Against the prevailing view that Hobbes simply sought 'to bring the teachings of the Bible into accordance with [political] doctrines that, by this point of Leviathan, he had already established' (135), Stauffer thinks that Hobbes was cunningly fostering 'a sober scepticism' towards the Bible and its alleged miracles, such that people would eventually see them as 'relics of a primitive age' (179).
Chapters 6 and 7 address Hobbes's political philosophy. Some of this material is fairly straightforward, with a useful account of Hobbes's science of politics (186-7), a sensible reading of Hobbes's 'morality of compliant civility' (227), and the traditional flogging of a dead Taylor-Warrender thesis (223-6). I wish Hobbes scholars would sidestep this sterile debate.
Much more penetrating is a fascinating analysis of what Stauffer sees as Christian morality's golden rule, 'do as you would be done by', and Hobbesian morality's silver rule, the weaker precept 'don't do as you wouldn't be done by'. Far from Hobbes trying to show that Christian and Hobbesian moralities are the same, Stauffer believes that Hobbes was depicting Christian morality as imposing 'far greater demands' than rational Hobbesian morality (159). 'Adherence to the Hobbesian rule may require a modicum of self-restraint, but it does not require serious self-sacrifice'. Hobbes 'sometimes pretends' that the two are equivalent, but 'by encouraging readers to compare the two, he lets us see the difference for ourselves' (227-8).
Consider the comment in Leviathan chapter 14 paragraph 5 where Hobbes refers to the 'Law of the Gospel; Whatsoever you require that others should do to you, that do ye to them. And that Law of all men, Quod tibi fieri non vis, alteri ne feceris', which is the silver rule (Leviathan 14.5). I agree with Stauffer that Hobbes here looks as if he is indeed differentiating the two moralities: the 'law of all men' sounds narrower than the law of the gospel.
Nonetheless, caution is needed here. Hobbes says many different things and regularly contradicts himself. For example, while he sometimes summarises the laws of nature in terms of the silver rule (Elements of Law 18.9; De Cive 3.26; Leviathan 15.35, 109), he also summarises it as a combination of two principles: love God, and love your neighbour as yourself (Elements of Law 29.7; see also De Cive 17.8). This fits Stauffer's position less well.
My first concern with Stauffer's book is thus that the evidence for his hypothesis is less one-sided than he mostly implies. Some passages make Hobbes sound more orthodox, as just exemplified. And while Stauffer is careful not to read Hobbes's comments out of their context, he does seem to do so in claiming that Hobbes thought the creation of the world sufficed 'to prove a Deity' (123-5). But in this passage, from Considerations upon the Reputation of Thomas Hobbes (in Hobbes's English Works vol. 4 pp. 427-8), Hobbes is merely discussing a view attributed to him, a view he does not then confirm. Indeed, 'proving' the existence of God is rather un-Hobbesian.
The most important reason why Stauffer's evidence is less one-sided than he thinks is that many allegedly esoteric passages may have more innocuous explanations. And this reflects my second concern: Stauffer ideally needs more consideration of alternative explanations of Hobbes's alleged esotericism. Interpretation is a comparative enterprise: ideally, we should not just look for evidence that fits our hypothesis, but also consider what does not fit, and we should do the same for plausible alternatives (Blau 2015a, 1184-7). As an illustration, consider Masoud Bonyanian's weak effort to show that Strauss influenced American neoconservatives under George W. Bush: Bonyanian thinks Strauss's defence of noble lies led neoconservatives to lie about the reasons for the Iraq war (Bonyanian 2009, 44-5). But Bonyanian's explanation is inadequate: I am told that even politicians who have not read Strauss occasionally tell lies (Blau 2015b, 33-4).
Stauffer's approach is far more careful than this, of course, but there are still many times when we need more discussion of the main competing explanation: that Hobbes is simply being inconsistent. Hobbes is trying to show consistency between arguments that actually clash; he believes his political and moral principles are right, and for contextual reasons needs to show that they embody Biblical principles; but unsurprisingly, he cannot square the circle.
So, the irreligious implications of many of Hobbes's arguments could be intentional or unintentional. And the safest way to resolve this problem is not by trying to show that this was intentional, but by asking if it was intentional or not. Interpretation is comparative: we need both sides of the picture.
True, Stauffer's alternative hypothesis has not been taken seriously by Hobbes's interpreters either. Strauss deserves some of the blame here: his own esoteric interpretations were so obviously flawed that they have held back the cause of esoteric interpretation by decades. But Stauffer shows that this particular hypothesis is viable, and now it needs more comparative testing. In fairness, Stauffer's book is already long and detailed. But the next stage of the analysis will be the crucial test, I suggest.
My third concern is that Stauffer's esoteric interpretations are sometimes unconvincing. For example, Stauffer implies that Hobbes may not actually believe certain unimpressive claims he makes about humans being driven by self-interest (196). But the centrality of self-interest follows from Hobbes's account of deliberation and passion. It is so fundamental to his enterprise that a weak argument supporting it is probably just a weak argument, not an esoteric hint. Sometimes a cigar is just a cigar; sometimes an inconsistency is just an inconsistency.
Stauffer does accept that some weaknesses in Hobbes's political/moral arguments reflect not 'rhetorical guile' but 'his failure to see the inconsistency of his position' (220). But -- my fourth concern -- Stauffer needs to explain why this is true of his political/moral views and not his religious ones. Again, hypothesis-testing in textual interpretation is comparative, just as it is in the social and natural sciences. (One huge error in our methodological literature is to talk of something called 'hermeneutics' which is part of the humanities. But when we ask what authors meant and why they wrote what they wrote, these are essentially empirical questions, and the best logic of inference that humans have yet developed to answer empirical questions is scientific. See especially Blau 2015b, 42-50. I also made this argument implicitly -- esoterically -- in Blau 2015a, although the subtext will be evident to perceptive readers.)
Unless Stauffer can explain why Hobbes's inconsistencies and weaknesses constitute esoteric hints in religious contexts and not elsewhere, we might conclude that Hobbes was not actually sending esoteric hints. Or -- given that there are so many inconsistencies and weaknesses in Hobbes's non-religious arguments -- we might conclude that Hobbes did not believe most of what he wrote on science, mathematics, ethics, politics, history, rhetoric, and so on. You name it, Hobbes apparently didn't believe it.
But such a conclusion would also undermine Stauffer's thesis, which assumes the sincerity of Hobbes's political and moral arguments, with esoteric religious arguments in support of them. Nor does it fit Hobbes's psychology, as brought out in Douglas Jesseph's (1999) wonderful analysis of Hobbes's mathematical career, which shows Hobbes not only at his best but also his worst, displaying almost Trumpian levels of obstinacy and sometimes idiocy. In chapter 5 of Leviathan Hobbes writes that even 'the ablest' may deceive themselves. And wow, was Hobbes able.
My fifth and final concern is that if Stauffer is right, Hobbes would have weakened, not strengthened, his push for a rational enlightenment: he would have solidified far more people's faith in Christianity than he would have converted to secularism, and he would have led them to reject his moral and political arguments too. Faced with unorthodox readings of the Bible, controversial moral and political positions, and unconvincing efforts to reconcile the two, most readers would simply reject Hobbes in his entirety. Perhaps Hobbes thought this was a price worth paying to convince a few perceptive readers; perhaps he simply misjudged. But Stauffer's focus only on Hobbes's most perceptive readers raises tricky questions about Hobbes's strategy. And it undermines his claim that Hobbes's moral teaching was 'more likely to draw men away from belief than toward it' (236).
(This is a weaker version of one of my objections to Strauss. If Machiavelli were the 'perfect' writer Strauss supposes, there should be evidence that he changed people's minds in the way Strauss hypothesises, but it seems that the first person to uncover Machiavelli's codes was Strauss himself, which means Machiavelli misjudged, which means he was not a perfect writer, which means he probably did not use these codes. Stauffer does not assume Hobbes's perfection but does assume an implausible calculus of conversion, which casts doubt on the esoteric hypothesis. Again, it helps to step outside of the hypothesis and looks for its testable implications. See Blau 2012, 151-2; Blau 2015a, 1187-9; Blau 2015b, 35-6.)
My concerns about Stauffer's esoteric hypothesis are not rejections: Stauffer's hypothesis must be taken seriously. He produces ample evidence for Hobbes's esotericism, much of it distinctly plausible, and his position is more convincing than the positions of many of his opponents, not least historians such as J.G.A. Pocock who naively assume that Hobbes would hardly have written so much on religion if it was nonsense (127).
In sum, Stauffer's book should be read by Hobbes scholars and by early modern specialists more generally, as well as anyone interested in history of philosophy in relation to metaphysics, religion, science, politics and ethics.
Most importantly, the book should be read by anyone keen to see what sensible, careful Straussian esoteric interpretation looks like. Leo Strauss gave esoteric interpretation a bad name. Stauffer gives it a good one.
Bagley, Paul. 1992. 'On the practice of esotericism', Journal of the History of Ideas 53(2), 231-47.
Blau, Adrian, 2012. 'Anti-Strauss', The Journal of Politics 74(1), 142-55.
Blau, Adrian. 2015b. 'The irrelevance of (Straussian) hermeneutics', in Winfried Schröder, ed., Reading Between the Lines: Leo Strauss and the History of Early Modern Philosophy. Berlin: De Gruyter, 29-55.
Bonyanian, Masoud, 2009. Muslims' Perceptions of the Bush Doctrine: Bridging the Gap With Islam. Münster: LIT Verlag.
Jesseph, Douglas. 1999. Squaring the Circle: The War Between Hobbes and Wallis. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.