Hobbes's On The Citizen: A Critical Guide

Hobbes On The Citizen A Critical Guide

Robin Douglass and Johan Olsthoorn (eds.), Hobbes's On The Citizen: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 251pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108421980.

Reviewed by Sandra Leonie Field, Yale-NUS College, Singapore


The perennial interest in the philosophy of Thomas Hobbes shows no sign of slowing down. The rush of edited volumes commemorating the 350th anniversary of the publication of his masterpiece Leviathan (1651) has been followed by a steady stream of collections guided by various themes -- Hobbes and the law, feminist interpretations of Hobbes, Hobbes and religion, Hobbes's contemporary relevance -- as well as new general companion volumes every number of years. Robin Douglass and Johan Olsthoorn's book nonetheless makes a distinctive and welcome contribution not addressed by any of the previous volumes. It seeks to determine the political philosophy of Hobbes's less well known book De Cive (1642/1647; referred to throughout the volume as On the Citizen). Although Douglass and Olsthoorn's volume is perhaps of less contemporary or general interest than other recent thematic volumes -- due to intrinsic features of its topic, but also due to the particular approach the volume takes in addressing its topic, as I will explain -- it should be of great relevance for advanced scholarship, both in Hobbes studies and in the history of Western political thought more broadly.

On the Citizen is the second of three recensions of Hobbes's political philosophy: it is preceded by The Elements of Law (1640), and followed by Leviathan. When an author multiply rewrites essentially the same book, surely it is reasonable to favour the final version as superior, rather than explore the middle version on its own terms? To the contrary, Douglass and Olsthoorn's stated aim is 'to show that On the Citizen is a valuable and distinctive philosophical work in its own right, and not merely a stepping-stone towards the more famous Leviathan.' (p. i)

The editors cite both historical and philosophical reasons for this focus on On the Citizen. The first historical reason is powerful and (to this reviewer's mind) independently fully sufficient to justify attention to On the Citizen. While Hobbes's Leviathan has been taken as authoritative by English speakers, Hobbes's European reception has predominantly relied upon On the Citizen (pp. 2-4). Thus, scholarship concerned with Hobbes's influence on any non-Anglophone figures of the history of political thought -- such as Spinoza, Rousseau, or (via Rousseau) Kant -- cannot afford to ignore On the Citizen, or to take Leviathan's pronouncements as the definitive version of Hobbes's philosophy. Another historical reason is that the two texts were composed under dramatically different political conditions: it is possible that some of the changes were made for contextual reasons without necessarily improving the cogency of Hobbes's arguments (p. 6). Somewhat secondarily, the editors also offer philosophical reasons. On the Citizen is written with greater concision and (arguably) clarity than the later Leviathan. Moreover, whereas the other recensions present Hobbes's political philosophy as an outgrowth of a detailed discussion of human nature, uniquely in On the Citizen Hobbes claims to offer a view of politics that is intelligible without reference to his other philosophical commitments (p. 4-5).

Thus, there are reasons to pay attention to On the Citizen. But I see two possible interpretations of volume's stated aim cited above. More strongly, the aim might be to read On the Citizen entirely on its own terms, not in comparison to Hobbes's other works. More weakly, comparisons may be acceptable and desirable, but the volume's distinctive aim is to explore these comparisons without viewing On the Citizen as a 'stepping stone' -- that is, without reading a teleology within Hobbes's thought towards its crowning expression in Leviathan. Methodologically, this weaker aim would demand, first, that philosophical commitments made in Leviathan should not be uncritically read back into On the Citizen, and second, that the superiority of Leviathan's arguments stands as a question to be argued rather than starting presumption (pp. 5-6).

Four of the volume's essays are in line with the stronger aim, with the remainder fitting better with the weaker aim. And this mixture seems appropriate. While on some topics it is possible to offer a self-contained consideration of On the Citizen, on other topics such an approach would make little sense. If Leviathan had never occupied its dominant place in Hobbes scholarship, then one could treat On the Citizen as a piece of philosophy purely on its own terms. But in light of the saturation of the Anglophone understanding of Hobbes with Leviathan's formulations, On the Citizen's distinctive contributions often cannot be made visible without going through the labour of differentiating it from Leviathan.

The volume opens with Deborah Baumgold and Ryan Harding's chapter, 'Excavating On the Citizen', in which they offer an overall characterisation of the position of On the Citizen within Hobbes's philosophical oeuvre. They attribute to Hobbes two differing models of scientific inquiry: the formal/geometrical, and the substantive/empirical. The authors situate On the Citizen as the result of the intersection of these two models, improving and enriching the more purely formal account of duties from the Elements with more substantial psychological and political content. Their argument is carried out through fine-grained comparison of various key passages between the Elements and On the Citizen.

The rest of the volume comprises deep-dive essays on a broad range of more specific topics. The essays are organised thematically, following the tripartite division of On the Citizen itself -- 'Liberty', then 'Government', then 'Religion'. However, for the purposes of this review, let me present their contents according to a different division flagged above: whether they examine On the Citizen in its own right, or in its relation to Hobbes's other works.

Four chapters target elements of On the Citizen without significant reference to Hobbes's other writings.

Nicholas Gooding and Kinch Hoekstra's chapter, 'Hobbes and Aristotle on the Foundation of Political Science', argues that the opening of On the Citizen is structured as a systematic attack on Aristotle's theory of friendship and natural sociability.

Susanne Sreedhar's chapter, 'The Right of Nature and Political Disobedience: Hobbes's Puzzling Thought Experiment', draws out a tension in On the Citizen's theory of political obligation. It is morally permissible for a subject to disobey the sovereign's command to kill their own parent, both because obedience to such a command would be so shameful as to be a fate worse than death, and because that obedience is not necessary for the sovereign to achieve their purposes (another executioner could be found). But this theory raises a conflict: when a commanded act is both shameful and necessary to the sovereign's purposes, disobedience is both permissible and impermissible.

Laurens van Apeldoorn's chapter, 'Property and Despotic Sovereignty', presses a novel reading of Hobbes's theory of property, whereby ownership requires not merely right but also de facto possession. In light of this theory of property, a Hobbesian sovereign can be said to own their subjects and all their subjects' possessions, regardless of subjects' retained rights. As a corollary, subjects cannot hold property titles against the sovereign.

A. P. Martinich's chapter, 'Sovereign-Making and Biblical Covenants in On the Citizen', argues that Hobbes gives a two-track theory of covenants, differentiating biblical covenants from sovereign-making covenants: in the former, the ruler (God) is a party to the covenant, whereas in the latter, the ruler (the sovereign) is not. Martinich argues that Hobbes favoured the sovereign-making model, and only stopped short of applying this model to biblical covenants in order to avoid generating unnecessary controversy.

Seven chapters consider On the Citizen in relation to Hobbes's other works.

S. A. Lloyd's chapter, 'All the Mind's Pleasure: Glory, Self-Admiration, and Moral Motivation in On the Citizen and Leviathan', argues that On the Citizen's theory of glory -- glossed by Lloyd as 'feeling good in virtue of having a good opinion of oneself' -- presents an underexplored motivation for good moral conduct. Lloyd suggests that Leviathan's arguments would be strengthened by reincorporating this theory from Hobbes's earlier work.

Michael LeBuffe's chapter, 'Motivation, Reason, and the Good in On the Citizen', targets On the Citizen's theory of right reason, according to which humans have access to right reason by nature. LeBuffe argues that this theory is upheld in neither Hobbes's earlier nor his later writings. He concludes that the theory is a rushed and insincere presentation of Hobbes's views that should not be taken seriously.

Daniel Lee's chapter, 'Sovereignty and Dominium: The Foundations of Hobbesian Statehood', focuses (like van Apeldoorn's chapter) on On the Citizen's proprietary conception of sovereignty, whereby the sovereign is modelled as a master over slaves. Lee shows that this conception applies as equally to sovereigns established by 'institution' (lateral agreement amongst citizens) as sovereigns established by 'acquisition' (conquest), and he argues that this same conception is maintained in Leviathan, only with strategic changes of terminology to avoid inflaming his English readership. The difference between sovereignty by institution and by acquisition ends up being a more subtle difference of the inner structure of obligation amongst citizens.

Famously, Hobbes conceives a commonwealth as a corporate person. Michael J. Green's chapter, 'Corporate Persons without Authorization', traces three distinct attempts within On the Citizen to provide a theory of corporate personhood. With some caveats, Green finds all three inferior to Leviathan's later authorization theory.

Thomas Holden's chapter, 'Hobbes on Love and Fear of God', argues that On the Citizen retains the traditional theistic language of love and fear of God without its traditional interpersonal affective content. Reading On the Citizen in the context of Hobbes's other contemporaneous writings, Holden argues that the posited duty of love and fear of God are exhaustively constituted by obedience to the laws of nature.

Alison McQueen's chapter, '"A Rhapsody of Heresies": The Scriptural Politics of
On the Citizen', argues that while Hobbes's core religious claims remain unchanged between The Elements of Law and On the Citizen, there is a sharp and underappreciated Hebraic turn in Hobbes's strategy of argument. This change is explained in light of the evolving religious context in England during the time Hobbes was writing.

Johann Sommerville's chapter, 'On the Citizen and Church-State Relations', focuses on the relation between Hobbes's religious claims in On the Citizen and in Leviathan. Sommerville traces the history of the texts' printing and reception to support the view that the differences between the texts are only superficial. The comparatively weaker anti-papalism of On the Citizen is not a deep difference, but rather is explained as a strategic choice in light of its publication in Catholic France.

The volume's twelve essays offer an excellent thematic spread, and also some disciplinary spread beyond philosophy into intellectual history. But to be clear, this book will not serve a general audience. Each volume in the Cambridge 'Critical Guides' series provides a balanced offering of cutting-edge scholarship on a specific text, for the interest of scholars and graduate students. In line with this series aim, Douglass and Olsthoorn's volume is strongly oriented towards an expert audience. It is not a guide in the sense of offering materials that might orient general readers or beginners. Indeed, it presumes a deep prior immersion in Hobbes studies. It takes for granted a strong familiarity with both Leviathan and On the Citizen. Not even in the volume's introduction does it provide an outline of On the Citizen's content or overall argument, except to say that it is a more concise and systematic version of Leviathan. Nor do any of the chapters provide such an overview.

For the expert audience, however, I can highly recommend the volume. To this reviewer's mind, the quality of the contributions is high, and I would single out the essays by van Apeldoorn and Sreedhar for particular praise.

My only criticism is to point out lacunae in the volume's coverage: I would have welcomed more consideration of the history of On the Citizen's influence beyond the Anglosphere. Given that a powerful motivation for reading On the Citizen is the historical fact that it was the preeminent non-Anglophone point of access to Hobbes's thought, it is striking that none of the essays touch on this topic. I would have been interested to hear studies of On the Citizen's reception in the works of other figures in the history of philosophy -- this would be especially valuable for readers with interests beyond Hobbes studies narrowly construed.[1] I would also have been interested to hear from present-day non-Anglophone Hobbes scholarship. The contributors to the volume are predominantly trained and employed in Anglophone institutions, but might non-Anglophone scholars present fresh interpretations and emphases, given that they do not share the long history of excess focus on Leviathan which so troubles the volume's editors? Certainly, in my own work, the extraordinary contribution of an earlier generation of French scholarship (notably Alexandre Matheron) has furnished perspectives unavailable in English.

Perhaps I should retract my criticism and reframe it as an invitation for further research. Douglass and Olsthoorn's sharp editorial focus on considering On the Citizen in its own right and in relation to Hobbes's oeuvre lends their volume a certain structure and coherence. But their work lays the groundwork for future investigation into the impact and afterlives of On the Citizen beyond the Anglosphere.

The stated aim of Douglass and Olsthoorn's volume is to grasp On the Citizen in its own right, and not as a mere stepping stone to Leviathan, and the excellent essays of the volume together advance us towards that aim. Nonetheless, the editors suggest that their volume should be valuable even to those who remain unconvinced of the need to jettison the teleological approach (pp. 5-6). For the structure and strategy of Leviathan's arguments can be better understood once we have a fuller grasp of Hobbes's own alternative formulations of his views. Ultimately, Douglass and Olsthoorn's hope is a modest one: to offer a 'richer and more nuanced picture of Hobbes's moral and political philosophy' (pp. 11, i). And in this ambition, the volume amply succeeds.


[1] Indeed, Robin Douglass's own monograph Rousseau and Hobbes: Nature, Free Will, and the Passions (Oxford University Press, 2015) is exemplary in its attention to On the Citizen.