Hoekema's Review of Wilshire

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Reply to Hoekema's Review of Wilshire (NDPR 2002.10.04)

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Texas, Austin


David Hoekema’s review of Bruce Wilshire’s latest tiresome tirade against anyone who doesn’t do philosophy his way spends rather too much time repeating canards and slanders about me and the Philosophical Gourmet Report (hereafter “PGR”), a report which I have produced, with the assistance of hundreds of philosophers, for many years now. I am grateful to Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews for an opportunity to reply to these charges.

(1) Professor Hoekema endorses Professor Wilshire’s complaint that the PGR “is biased strongly toward analytic approaches” and that analytic philosophy is my “own camp” of philosophy. On its face, this charge is very puzzling. I am the author of one book on Nietzsche – a typical “Continental” figure I would have imagined – and the co-editor of two others; I am the author of articles on Schopenhauer, Marx, and Heidegger; I am a teacher of courses covering Hegel and Foucault. I am presently even one of two editors of The Oxford Handbook of Continental Philosophy. Professor Hoekema himself ends up quoting my own criticisms of “analytic” philosophy; even The New York Times has quoted me to the same effect. The PGR itself gives substantial coverage to Continental philosophy, and the Advisory Board and evaluators for the PGR include many of the most distinguished scholars of Continental philosophy. Why don’t these obvious facts give Professor Hoekema pause before accusing me and the PGR of a “bias” towards “analytic” philosophy?

(2) Professor Hoekema complains that “one of the most troublesome examples of…misuse” of the PGR was the fact that the first edition of Lingua Franca’s Real Guide to Grad School “relied far too heavily on Leiter’s often idiosyncratic ratings but failed to acknowledge their slant.” Of course, the fact that Lingua Franca relied heavily on the PGR in both the first and second editions of its Real Guide to Grad School might, in rational discourse, be taken as evidence that the PGR is not at all idiosyncratic. Indeed, the recently released second edition of the Real Guide (New York: Academic Partners, 2001) spends two pages rehearsing criticisms of the PGR only to undercut them all by concluding: “The majority of professors the Real Guide contacted said that they believe the Gourmet Report is substantially accurate and valuable” (p. 273). Lingua Franca, with its close connection to the Modern Language Association and the Stony Brook Philosophy Department, hardly had any reason to be charitable on this score, yet even they could find no grounds for deeming the PGR “idiosyncratic.”

(3) Perhaps these misunderstandings of the PGR should not be surprising given that Professors Hoekema and Wilshire appear not to know what it is “analytic” philosophers do or believe. Professor Wilshire thinks analytic philosophers, as a class, “divide the emotive from the cognitive, and the moral from the factual,” and that analytic philosophers now “embrace ‘phenomenalism.’” Professor Hoekema reports these charges without editorial comment. An exemplary professional service like Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews should not permit such a gross misrepresentation of analytic philosophy to stand. Hardly any analytic philosophers are phenomenalists, and analytic philosophers hold a myriad of views about the relationship between reason and emotion, and facts and values, with many questioning these very distinctions. One might reasonably worry that Professor Wilshire’s sophomoric misunderstanding of what he attacks may vitiate his criticisms.

(4) Professor Hoekema quotes my own assessment that “analytic” philosophy is mostly a stylistic category: “analytic” philosophy as a substantive philosophical program is long dead. (In this sense only do I plead guilty to a “bias” in favor of “analytic” philosophy – though it might more accurately be called a “bias” [sic] in favor of clear and rigorous scholarship.) We are now living in a “golden age” of scholarship on Continental philosophy, almost all of which is produced by philosophers who are – again, in the stylistic sense – “analytic.” Even those who are avowedly skeptical of “analytic” history of philosophy – like Frederick Beiser, one of the greatest scholars writing in English about classical German philosophy – are really critical of a paradigm of philosophy that died in Oxford in the 1970s; they, too, share the characteristically “analytic” commitment to argumentative clarity and precision. There are, to be sure, narrow-minded philosophers, with parochial views of the discipline, but being “analytic” philosophers simply isn’t what they have in common.

(5) Professor Hoekema claims the misnamed “pluralist” movement, with which Professor Wilshire is allied, “succeeded.” But what is the evidence – beyond the dilution in quality of one of the three annual meetings of the APA – for this extraordinary claim? “Today,” says Professor Hoekema, “the annual meeting of the Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy [SPEP] is one of the largest philosophical gatherings in the country.” But the roughly 300 participants who attend a typical SPEP annual meeting include a significant contingent (judging from recent programs, perhaps as much as a third) who don’t teach in philosophy departments, while the philosophers come overwhelmingly from less than 20 departments in the entire United States. Professor Wilshire, like SPEP, speaks for that small minority of academic philosophers who have been bypassed by the collapse of a substantive dispute between analytic and Continental philosophy, and the concomitant and dramatic improvement in scholarly and intellectual standards for serious work on Continental philosophy that has resulted. Mediocre academics can no longer hide behind the fig leaf of “Continental philosophy” to explain why “analytic” philosophers don’t take them seriously – certainly not when the bastions of “analytic” philosophy like Princeton, Oxford, Cambridge, London, Pittsburgh, Stanford, Michigan, etc. all now hire scholars of Continental philosophy. (None of these programs hired “pluralists” or SPEP members, by the way.)

(6) As Professor Hoekema notes, Professor Wilshire “attributes great influence [to the PGR] among administrators as well as prospective students….” This, I believe, is what really has Wilshire and his “pluralist” colleagues agitated. A Continental philosophy scholar has produced a report on graduate study in philosophy, with the help of hundreds of philosophers, many of them also scholars of Continental philosophy. That report now gets 10,000 hits per month on the Web, and has had a significant impact on the decisions made by prospective students and administrators. This has been a catastrophe for the self-anointed bastions of “pluralism,” which do not fare well in the PGR, but which also have depended on the bogeyman of “analytic” philosophy for so long to explain their marginal status. (The “pluralists” now account for nearly half the signatories of the on-line letter protesting the PGR, a letter which after nearly a year has garnered a mere 2% of the entire profession as signatories.) It turns out, however, that the bogeyman is dead, and that the “pluralists” are actually just marginal to philosophy, “analytic” or “Continental”. When Professor Wilshire recommends, as he did in his last book on The Primal Roots of American Philosophy (2000), that philosophers need to appreciate shaman healing practices, he is not a philosophical pluralist, but simply a philosophical outlier, with no connection or relevance to any of the many glorious traditions in philosophy, from Aristotle to Nietzsche, from Descartes to Quine, from Hume to Husserl. Those who suffer from their powerlessness and marginalization, Nietzsche understood, also typically suffer from a peculiar emotion, which Nietzsche called ressentiment. That emotion, I fear, is now on furious display in the reckless polemics of Professor Wilshire.