Homo Interpretans: Towards a Transformation of Hermeneutics

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Johann Michel, Homo Interpretans: Towards a Transformation of Hermeneutics, David Pellauer (tr.), Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 291pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786608826.

Reviewed by Gert-Jan van der Heiden, Radboud University


In which sense is interpretation a defining characteristic of the human being? In which sense is interpretation a valid method for the human and social sciences to arrive at better understanding? These two questions form the core of Johann Michel's rich, erudite, sometimes dazzling and above all ambitious book. By combining the questions, Michel hopes to develop a sense of interpretation that covers "the two faces of the act of interpreting" (xix). Thus, he aims to overcome the dichotomy between the epistemological sense of interpretation held by Dilthey and the ontological sense of interpretation held by Heidegger. Michel is a world-leading expert on Paul Ricoeur. Against this background, one may understand this study as an attempt to offer a new version of a hermeneutics that follows a long trajectory and takes a detour along (especially) the human and social sciences.

The first core question guides Michel in his quest to develop an anthropology in the sense of Gehlen and Scheler, to show, in discussion with the sciences, how interpretation is central to human existence. The definition of interpretation should be neither too broad nor too restricted, as Michel emphasizes more than once. Neither is hermeneutics limited to the interpretation of texts, nor can it be extended to all forms of understanding. Rather, as is noted in the introduction, "Homo interpretans becomes manifest when the world of signification has lost its self-evidence" (xviii). Humans begin to interpret when they encounter something they do not immediately understand because it is obscure, distorted, hidden, and so on, that is, when the immediate understanding of the meaning of something is interrupted.

To develop this anthropology, Michel shows how, from a scientific point of view, interpretation itself can be understood as the outcome of certain evolutionary processes of the human animal and how interpretation by human beings is thus both in continuity with and different from forms of proto-interpretation that we also find in certain animals. Genuine interpretation, however, arises at the stage where either the world or our sense of self is not self-evident and humans begin to seek a mediate understanding. This, Michel argues pointing to the results of a number of scientific studies, is universally characteristic of human beings. In developing his thesis, Michel discusses several forms of anthropology and offers a very illuminating reinterpretation of the discussion between Ricoeur and Levi-Strauss on totemic and kerygmatic cultures.  Michel offers a nuanced and insightful overview of possible, different ways in which the phenomena in the world may have lost their self-evidence and require interpretation: strangeness, confusion, obscurity, figured or latent meaning, equivocity. In addition, he offers a subtle categorization of "interpretationals," which are the different interpretive practices we have at our disposal in everyday life to acquire a mediate understanding: clarification, simplification, explication, explanation, exemplification, identification, categorization and classification. Self-evidence is lost in many ways, and many ways to interpret exist in these situations.

The second core question regarding the methodological dimension of interpretation (also called "meta-interpretation" to distinguish it from the everyday forms of interpretation that were discussed in the first part) is at the heart of Michel's attempt to show the relevance and importance of hermeneutics for the human and social sciences. Here Michel aims to distance hermeneutics from the "relativist" and "ontologized" tendencies he discerns in hermeneutic projects inspired by thinkers as diverse as Nietzsche, Vattimo, Rorty, Gadamer, Derrida and Heidegger, in order to reattach hermeneutics to the question of method and restore the epistemological contribution of hermeneutics to the human sciences. Michel's goal is to show how hermeneutics offers the means to distinguish between better and worse interpretations. To achieve this, he reexamines the debates on hermeneutics of history engaged in by Dilthey, Droysen and many others, in order to show how history requires its own forms of explanation. He also discusses the perhaps paradigmatic case of medical hermeneutics in which the questions of cure of the body and care of the self are always intertwined and scientific modes of explanation are integrated with attempts of self-understanding to which diseases and their treatments give rise.

The scope of this study is impressive. Michel's goal seems to be nothing less than to offer a truly comprehensive sense of what interpretation is in human affairs, and, indeed, in several respects his approach is more comprehensive than one usually finds in the literature. However, given this ambition, it is remarkable that Michel has decided not to discuss the meaning of interpretation in the context of theology and biblical exegesis. After all, theology and biblical exegesis, along with legal hermeneutics and philology, form the very basis of hermeneutical practice. A study purporting to offer a genuine overall assessment of hermeneutics should include them. One could ask whether, especially in relation to the ontological understanding of hermeneutics along the lines of Heidegger and Gadamer, a better sense for this line of hermeneutics would have allowed Michel to offer different assessments. For instance, regarding Gadamer, Michel takes on the well-known issue that Gadamer prefers to speak of understanding differently rather than of understanding better. Yet, can one truly understand Gadamer's thesis in terms of epistemological relativism when it aims to speak of how the text can address every I as a Thou, despite the different historical situation in which readers find themselves? In the background here we discern instead the idea of a contemporaneity with the text which speaks to the universality of the experience that a text gives something to understand equally to every reader, albeit in a different way. Relativity is not the main issue here, it seems to me.

Another weakness of the book concerns the multitude of themes, theories and authors that are discussed. These discussions are quite often so concise that the reader is dazzled by the speed at which Michel arrives at conclusions and moves on to other themes. His discussion of Nietzsche, Vattimo, Rorty, Heidegger, Derrida and Gadamer (chapter 4) especially suffers from this. For instance, what does it actually mean philosophically to criticize Nietzsche for not offering us a model of scientific progress -- after all, understanding better is a form of progress -- when Nietzsche's target is rationality as a whole and when Nietzsche offers us a sense of what scientific interpretation is as an expression of will to truth or will to power? Here, the discussion is somewhat unbalanced. It reads as Michel stating his convictions rather than as Michel engaging philosophically with the questions Nietzsche's oeuvre poses.

As mentioned above, one might read this study as offering a new version of what Ricoeur called the long trajectory of hermeneutics: in contrast to the short trajectory of the Heideggerian ontologized version of hermeneutics, Ricoeur aimed to incorporate the discussion with certain forms of explanations in his own critical hermeneutics. This comparison with Ricoeur, which is invoked at several stages, shows in another sense both the strength and the weakness of Michel's overall approach. Much more than Ricoeur, Michel is willing to extend the contributions of all kinds of explanatory approaches, not even limiting or restricting in advance the contribution of causal explanations to a critical hermeneutics. His knowledge of the different sciences and relevant discussions is impressive, allowing him to paint a very nuanced picture of the multiple ways in which hermeneutics can indeed offer approaches for finding better interpretations, and how interpretation is at stake in the human and social sciences. However, there is also a particular weakness in Michel's approach. The existential or ontological gist that motivates both Heidegger's short and Ricoeur's long trajectory is ultimately lacking in Michel's study. For Ricoeur, discussion with results from the sciences is always a detour in order to ultimately return to question of what these results mean for an understanding of our life-world and for self-understanding. In Michel's book, however, the moment of such a return is absent. It lacks a section on how these scientific understandings can be genuinely appropriated as part of a narrative of who we are, and how they rob us of certain illusions concerning ourselves while at the same time offer an attestation of what humans are capable of.

In this sense, the recent work of Rudolf Makkreel, which is marked by a concern similar  to Michel's but conspicuously absent from Michel's study, is more convincing. Makkreel's interpretation is related to our capacity to judge and orient ourselves. This capacity, Michel and Makkreel both fear, is too easily sidestepped in the ontological tradition of Heidegger and Gadamer. For Makkreel, however, the issue is not so much how interpretation is necessary in the different sciences, but rather how interpretation has a sense of genuinely orienting us, of offering a capacity to judge so that human subjectivity is preserved as the third constitutive element in interpretation, next to text and tradition. Perhaps we can read Michel's response to the second core question in this sense: this particular capacity to judge and orient is actualized in the sciences as well.

Compared to approaches of Ricoeur and Heidegger, Michel's claim that we are interpreting beings remains rather distant from their existential concern with hermeneutics. Given the non-stop reference to the sciences -- of which the reference to the hermeneutics that could be derived from quantum physics is the culmination point -- the hermeneutics proposed by Michel at times imparts a definite scientistic impression which leaves unclear how the reflection on either the existential-ontological concern is genuinely brought forward. Despite this reservation, however, it is important emphasize once again that this book is a genuine and rich treasure trove of discussions in anthropology and the sciences in which interpretation and meta-interpretation are assigned their proper place. At many places in the book, the reader is confronted with illuminating and insightful ideas that call for further reflection.