Honor, History, and Relationship: Essays in Second-Personal Ethics II

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Stephen Darwall, Honor, History, and Relationship: Essays in Second-Personal Ethics II, Oxford University Press, 2013, 285pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199662616.

Reviewed by D. Justin Coates, University of Houston


Opening his review of the Rolling Stones' Exile on Main St., Lenny Kaye writes:

There are songs that are better, there are songs that are worse, there are songs that'll become your favorites and others you'll probably lift the needle for when their time is due. But in the end, Exile on Main Street spends its four sides shading the same song in as many variations as there are Rolling Stone readymades to fill them, and if on the one hand they prove the group's eternal constancy and appeal, it's on the other that you can leave the album and still feel vaguely unsatisfied.[1]

Given the enduring critical acclaim that Exile has received in the subsequent four decades, this might seem like a weak endorsement of the 1972 album. But if you think this, you'd do well to remember that the album was released on the heels of Beggars BanquetLet it Bleed, and Sticky Fingers, which is arguably the strongest back-to-back-to-back three album combo in rock history.

Like the Stones following up Beggars Banquet, etc., any attempt to follow up Stephen Darwall's The Second-Person Standpoint (SPS) was sure to fail to live up to the "peaks that [SPS] held out as a special prize in the past." But of course, that Honor, History, and Relationship (HHR), which is the second volume of a pair of recently released Darwall collections, "fails" in this respect is no reason to dismiss it. As a whole, HHR is a successful development of the ideas Darwall has staked his well-earned (philosophical) fame on: (i) that irreducibly second-personal attitudes and relationships are the foundation of what we owe to each other and (ii) that the history of moral philosophy is a real source of philosophical enlightenment. The fact that anyone familiar with SPS could (for example) anticipate the shape of Darwall's theory of promises (developed in Chapter 7: "Demystifying Promises") is no strike against its philosophical import.

If you haven't read SPS or aren't already quite familiar with Darwall's work on the second-person standpoint, then you should probably start with that, rather than diving headlong into HHR (or its companion, Morality, Authority, and Law: Essays in Second-Personal Ethics I). For although there are a number of clear, pithy statements of the basic ideas that are contained in SPS littered throughout HHR, the systematic treatment of the second-person standpoint and its foundational role in moral obligation and accountability is found in SPS.

Briefly: in his previous volume, Darwall argues that moral obligation and accountability are grounded in the presuppositions of our interpersonal relationships. Following P. F. Strawson, Darwall characterizes our participation in such relationships in terms of the so-called "reactive attitudes," which include gratitude and resentment, esteem and indignation, etc.[2] But these attitudes, Darwall argues, are irreducibly "second-personal" because when I (e.g.) resent you for disregarding me, I address you not as an object to be managed or manipulated but as an agent with whom I am in a morally significant interpersonal relationship. In other words, in being engaged with one another through these attitudes, we necessarily take up a perspective on ourselves that "make[s] and acknowledge[s] claims on one another's conduct and will."[3] What we owe to each other, then, is given by the content of the second-personal norms of interpersonal engagement that are presupposed by the most basic forms of interpersonal interaction. That's much too fast, and there is, of course, much more that could be said about what exactly Darwall's up to in SPS, but since I want to talk about his new volume and not its predecessor (and because you really should go read that book anyway), I will now focus on Darwall's new collection.

Given its title, it's not too surprising that HHR is divided into three sections, each exploring one of these themes. In the first division, "Honor, Respect, and Accountability," Darwall extends the account of recognition respect that he famously developed in "Two Kinds of Respect" to issues of honor.[4] According to him, honor is concerned with a distinctive kind of recognition respect. However, whereas second-personal respect, which is the form of recognition respect that Darwall has explored at length elsewhere, underwrites our status as equal moral agents, honor underwrites "an essentially hierarchical social order," (17). This means that it is not mediated by potentially healthy moral emotions like resentment or indignation that presuppose the equal dignity of all, but by potentially poisonous ones like contempt and disdain, which seemed focused on our status relative to others. If this is right, and it at least seems plausible, then there is an apparent tension with recognizing others as having equal standing in the moral community and being concerned with honor.

In the subsequent chapters of the first part, Darwall goes on to develop these themes in light of Adam Smith's and Friedrich Nietzsche's (very different) work on moral emotions. In the case of Adam Smith (Chapter 2, "Smith's Ambivalence About Honor"), Darwall notes and explores Smith's ambivalence about the role of honor in the moral life. In particular, he argues that Smith has reason to be ambivalent about honor, since standards of honor are apparently in tension with the full recognition of all others as having equal dignity. To tease out this tension, Darwall returns to the account of honor he develops in Chapter 1, "Respect as Honor and as Accountability," and more explicitly underscores important differences between vengeance (and vengeful attitudes like contempt, etc.) and second-personal attitudes like resentment. And again, while he rejects the moral importance of vengeance, he does think that reactive attitudes like resentment play a role in facilitating and maintaining valuable forms of second-personal engagement.

Darwall develops this point in even more detail in his discussion of Nietzsche's critique of the moral emotions in Chapter 4, "Ressentiment and Second-Personal Resentment." There he compares the notion of ressentiment that appears in Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morality and the reactive attitudes of resentment, indignation, and guilt, at least as they appear in P. F. Strawson's "Freedom and Resentment." The main difference, Darwall argues, is that while ressentiment is a sublimated thirst for revenge, the reactive attitudes are direct calls for second-personal acknowledgement from wrongdoers. And here, there should be no ambivalence: the reactive attitudes are morally significant and defensible in a way that ressentiment is not.

It's at this point we get our first real glimpse of the optimism that runs throughout Darwall's book. Because second-personal reactions are shown to be conceptually distinct from problematic emotions and so rationally warranted, we apparently have no reason to fear the role that these emotions (and expressions of these emotions) play in our interpersonal lives. But while Darwall is certainly correct in thinking that there is conceptual space between the kind of vengeance that honor seems to require and resentment of the sort that acknowledges others' status as accountable agents and simultaneously calls for reciprocated acknowledgement of our own status as such, in practice the difference between ordinary expressions of resentment and small scale vengeance can be vanishingly small. And perhaps worryingly, on matters of whether we are justifiably resentful or are instead engaged in unwarranted vengeance, we are prone to a great deal of self-deception.

This, I take it, is at least part of the challenge that Nietzsche raises against commonsense morality in the Genealogy. Unfortunately, nothing Darwall says here will help us to answer this challenge. After all, the mere fact that some negative attitude I am in is justified is of little help in many cases given how easily this justified attitude and its expressions bleed into unjustified attitudes and behaviors. When am I truly resentful as opposed to contemptuous? And even harder to discern, when do my (warranted) attempts to express resentment come across to others as something worse, something less defensible? For even if my resentment is, as Adam Smith says (and Darwall endorses), "chiefly intent upon . . . [bringing the wrongdoer] back to a more just sense of what is due to other people, to make him sensible of what he owes us, and of the wrong that he has done us," outward expressions or manifestations of that resentment, e.g., stern rebukes that are modulated by an angry tone, can reasonably be thought to express contempt, disdain, and in many cases, self-righteousness.[5] Accordingly, resentment (and other reactive attitudes) might not be poisonous to us and to our relationships as such, but the emotions and behaviors that regularly accompany them appear to be. And without some way to guarantee that our warranted negative emotions are prevented from intermingling with those emotions that are not warranted, it seems that I have reason to eschew even seemingly innocent expressions of resentment, indignation, etc., even though the reactive attitudes are, as Darwall compellingly argues in every chapter of Part 1, conceptually distinct from vengefulness, contempt, and ressentiment.

The second division, "Relating to Others," focuses more directly on the ins and outs of second-personal relationships. There is perhaps less thematic unity in these chapters, but they nevertheless constitute an interesting and, to my mind, important contribution to our thinking about moral relationships. The first, Chapter 5: "Responsibility within Relations," focuses on the nature of holding others responsible within the context of reciprocal interpersonal relationships. Of major interest in this chapter is the idea that equal dignity is a background condition on reciprocal interpersonal relationships. This, Darwall argues, has significant implications for the kinds of attitudes that can be appropriate within that context. Contempt, for example, which involves viewing another as lower or less than oneself, is out of place in such relationships. But in addition to the conceptual tension between relating to another second-personally and feeling or expressing contempt towards them, Darwall also highlights some of the bad consequences contempt can have for our relationships. It is, as Darwall puts it, the "sulfuric acid of relationship" (109).

This is no doubt correct. But again, I can't help but be struck by the similarly corrosive role that resentment and expressions of resentment can also play in our personal relationships. It wouldn't do much, I think, to tell a close friend that my loud, angry complaint was actually an expression of resentment, which presupposes that she has equal dignity, and not an expression of contempt. The loud, angry complaint, regardless of what I take it to be expressing, itself invites a kind of defensiveness and hostility on my friend's part. And trying to assuage any defensiveness or hostility by introducing philosophical nuance seems (at best) condescending. It would be better, I think, if I were to work to hold her responsible through other means entirely, perhaps by discussing the issues calmly (or relatively calmly, where this means quieting my anger), by inviting a genuine dialog, and by working to acknowledge the role I often play in escalating bad situations. Why is this better? Well, not because it's necessarily the only fitting response, but because it's a way of responding to other intimates' failings that better facilitates a healthy relationship going forward. So I agree with Darwall that given the irreducibly second-personal nature of reciprocal interpersonal relationships, resentment can be a fitting response to wrongs in a way that contempt cannot. But given the value of such relationships, I think we might all have weighty reasons to modulate our resentment significantly, or perhaps even eschew it entirely, since it, too, can have corrosive affects on our lives with others.

Whereas Chapter 5 left me feeling "vaguely unsatisfied," Chapter 6: "Being With" is worth revisiting. Here, Darwall investigates what exactly is involved in "being with" someone else. Though the colloquial expression that one person "is with" another most naturally picks out just those who are in romantic or sexual relationships, Darwall argues that there is a richer and more nuanced way of being with someone else. To be with someone in his sense is to be involved in a second-personal relationship that is "jointly open" and infused with empathy. By arguing that empathy of various forms and not mere respect is necessary for the especially meaningful kinds of relations we have when we are with someone, Darwall makes room for some of the "messiness" and complexity that are inseparable from human relationships, particularly those aspects of human relationships that do not follow from the logic of mutual respect. Darwall is thus to be commended, since, unlike many in the Kantian and contractualist traditions, he does not reduce the normatively significant features of human relationships to the fact that such relationships have second-personal presuppositions, or that they are reciprocal, or that they require respect. By focusing on other elements of such relationships, it's here that one really sees how the Darwall of Welfare and Rational Care (2002) fits into the world of SPS.

In the final section, "History," Darwall turns his attention to second-personal aspects of the work of Grotius, Pufendorf, Kant, and Fichte. Not being a historian, I'm in no position to evaluate these papers by way of comparison to recent scholarly work on these figures. Nor am I able to suss out whether Darwall's insistence that there are second-personal elements in their work is really simply a self-serving anachronism. That said, these are excellent additions, at least from the perspective of someone interested in the nature of normativity, moral obligation, accountability, practical reasons, or autonomy. From this perspective, it seemed to me that the Fichte chapter was of the most interest, so I'll say a bit about that before concluding (though I should say, each of these chapters engaged me).

In Chapter 10, "Fichte and the Second-Person Standpoint," Darwall draws a contrast between the conception of practical reasoning invoked by Fichte and that of those who want to "conceive of deliberation in agent-neutral consequentialist terms" (236). The problem with this conception of deliberation that emerges from Fichte is that it fails to make sense of the agent's role in practical reasoning -- i.e., "on this familiar decision-theoretic picture, deliberation is entirely instrumental and transparent with respect to agency -- it looks through the deliberator's agency to what valuable states can be achieved" (236). For Fichte, it's only by seeing ourselves as being second-personally addressed or summoned by others' claims that we can make sense of ourselves as active participants in deliberation and not merely the venue in which goodness can be realized.

But while I'm not completely unsympathetic to Darwall's claim that there is a genuine worry that Fichte identifies with the familiar conception of deliberation, it's important to note that it's not obvious that there is actually any problem here, at least not one that doesn't assume the very thing that it's trying to demonstrate. After all, it seems perfectly fair for a consequentialist (of the right stripe) to say to Fichte that "yeah, when deliberation's done right, it mechanically picks out those courses of action that result in the best state of affairs possible. On my picture, if second-personal claims matter, then they will already be included in whatever goes into determining which states of affairs are best from the point of view of practical reason. So what's the problem with this again?" My imagined consequentialist might mean this last question rhetorically, but I don't. Even if the consequentialist is correct, I think there might be some problem in the neighborhood. Thus, the real issue, it seems to me, is not that the consequentialist endorses a passive, mechanical conception of deliberation; it's instead that he fails to appreciate the significance of distinctively second-personal reasons. Of course, a consequence of this might well be that the conception of deliberation invoked by consequentialists is impoverished. But if so, it's the result of some other problem inherent to such theories, and not the problem itself.

Like Exile on Main Street, this book has its highs and lows. And like Exile, its highs fail to reach the height of its predecessor. No chapters, for example, are as philosophically big and exciting as Chapters 4, 5, and 12 in SPS. As I have emphasized in this review, I would've liked it if Darwall had said more in defense of a number of the central ideas that are developed in the book. But nothing in this review should dissuade you from reading it. It's wide-ranging, historically grounded, thoughtful, and humane. In short, it's contemporary moral philosophy at its best.


I'd like to thank Dave Phillips and Neal Tognazzini for feedback on earlier drafts of this review.

[1] Lenny Kaye, "Exile on Main Street," Rolling Stone, May 12, 1972.

[2] Peter Strawson, "Freedom and Resentment," Proceedings of the British Academy 48 (1962): 1-25

[3] Stephen Darwall, The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (2006), 3.

[4] Stephen Darwall, "Two Kinds of Respect," Ethics 88.1 (1977): 36-49.

[5] Adam Smith, The Theory of Moral Sentiments II.iii.1.5.